Cosmopolitanism versus Non-Cosmopolitanism: Critiques, Defenses, Reconceptualisations

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Gillian Brock (ed.), Cosmopolitanism versus Non-Cosmopolitanism: Critiques, Defenses, Reconceptualisations, Oxford University Press, 2013, 331pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199678426.

Reviewed by Ariel Colonomos, CNRS/CERI-Sciences Po


While it offers a very interesting and diverse selection of essays on the political philosophy of cosmopolitanism, this volume helps us understand the specificity of cosmopolitanism vis-à-vis other approaches to justice. It also raises the important question of the extent to which the very notion of cosmopolitanism is still relevant today. Indeed, the contributors offer a confrontation between the arguments of the tenants of cosmopolitanism and those of their opponents in order to characterize and understand the phase cosmopolitanism is now in.

According to Richard Miller, cosmopolitanism has entered a very salutary "mid-life crisis", through which, it is hoped, it will rejuvenate itself (272). Michael Blake argues that the biggest challenge cosmopolitanism faces is not a rebuttal of its ideas (35-54). He maintains that, on the contrary, cosmopolitanism has been absorbed into mainline thinking in political philosophy and beyond and, as a result, has lost its specificity and its sharpness. This objection to cosmopolitanism is strongly rejected by Thomas Pogge, who, in his concluding chapter, argues that states persist in framing their policies according to very pragmatic and realist lines and decide to maximize their interests when they are confronted by what are seen as their competitors (294). Therefore, cosmopolitanism remains a sound alternative to what is still mainline practice.

The exchange between Blake and Pogge calls for clarification. Indeed, it is true that few academics would deny the worthiness of cosmopolitan ideals. Cosmopolitanism has pervaded political and moral philosophy and has also been widely debated and praised in other fields such as law and politics or sociology. Those who argue along patriotic lines form a minority, and the globalization of thinking within academia and their members has paralleled the trajectory of cosmopolitanism as a paradigm. Since the early 90s and the bicentennial anniversary of the publication of Kant's Project of Perpetual Peace in 1996, the conversion to cosmopolitanism has become massive. Moreover, as its enemies, notably in political science -- i.e., statism and realism -- have lost their sharpness, cosmopolitanism has lacked the opportunity to rejuvenate itself (hence the mid-life crisis). This does not preclude the fact that, in the realm of policy, in instances such as climate negotiations or security crises, interest based decisions continue to prevail. It is, however, important to note that Realpolitik (the practice of politics) differs from Realism (a social sciences paradigm). Although the role of norms, values and to some extent ethics has progressed in international relations (Katzenstein, 1996; Colonomos, 2008; Price, 2008), cosmopolitanism has not imposed itself as a framework for international politics.

This calls for a further question. Why has the cosmopolitan ideal been so unpersuasive in the field of practice? This question is central in a reflection on the assessment of cosmopolitanism, especially for authors such as Pogge for whom setting cosmopolitan norms on the agenda of international organizations is so important. Three sets of hypotheses must be set forth. The first highlights the inertia of those institutions to which cosmopolitan claims are often being made and that have been reluctant to adopt ideas of global justice because of their structural blockages or because of the radicality of cosmopolitan claims, as Lea Yipi underlines (while arguing that cosmopolitanism should not compromise with statism). The second draws a distinction between theory and practice. Cosmopolitanism would be good in theory and bad in practice. We would be confronted by a strong dichotomy between those who are in the ivory towers of academia and who have very little or no impact on the reality of international politics, and those who are in a position of political responsibility and who are dissociated from the evolution of theoretical thinking. The third one is more worrisome. The reason why cosmopolitanism has been unpersuasive might not lie in the selfishness of states: it might lie in its own lack of innovation. In other words, cosmopolitan ideas have to be more well-suited to penetrate the political sphere.

The cosmopolitan ideal faces difficulties when questions are raised about its institutionalization . This volume, unfortunately, does not provide any suggestion about the institutional reforms that would enable this process. Poverty or climate change, as well as other issues in the realm of defense or security, in order to be challenged, would need some legal and political reforms. Normative thinking should also elaborate some clear answers that would orient institutional design.

The locus of cosmopolitanism is indeed a puzzling question. As the different contributors underline, one of the most basic yet controversial principles of cosmopolitanism lies in the moral equality of individuals. This principle is widely accepted by philosophers who, however, also discuss the limits of its application. It can, indeed, be argued that individuals may have specific duties vis-à-vis particular individuals, such as their own children, that structure their behavior. According to an Impartiality Requirement, Pogge claims, of course, this should not be the case for institutions (295-97). One example is a school's representatives who cannot make decisions on the basis of their own private preferences. The analogy between the private behavior of parents and the public behavior of individuals would fail to be justified. Institutions should act impartially and enforce the rule that individuals are morally equal.

This reasoning, however,  might face an objection. What if for historical reasons, states had their own moral preferences that were not determined by their national interests? Let us imagine that some states decided to engage in some costly actions and decide to prioritize aid to some countries to the detriment of others. To what extent is the behavior of the US or European countries anti-cosmopolitan when they aid countries or ethnic groups in Africa whose former members have been severely hurt by slavery?

As for individuals, states can have specific duties that can translate into moral preferences in their moral policy. The unilateral morality of states might be incompatible with the institutionalization of cosmopolitan ideas. Yet, states can share cosmopolitan expectations, and multilateralism is not the only channel for the expression of cosmopolitanism. The question of the spheres of cosmopolitanism still needs to be elaborated, as the literature much too often focuses mostly on either the individual or international organizations. As Fabian Schuppert notes, cosmopolitan duties have also to be elaborated at the sub-world-state level and "strong cosmopolitanism can value collective agency without creating an unforgiving watchman in the form of a world state" (263).

Indeed, beyond the individual state divide, lies a meso-level characterized by its own set of cosmopolitan duties. Darrel Moellendorf argues here in favor of "associational duties" (222-238). This normative approach is grounded on both empirical and descriptive grounds. Most of us belong to an association that crosses borders through which we could and should express cosmopolitan duties. This approach, which brings together the normative and the empirical, shows the feasibility of cosmopolitan ideas in a context where social change can be attained more easily than in the context of multilateral reforms. The practice of tacit and informal cosmopolitanism informs us on the norms of cosmopolitanism.

Would cosmopolitan associations be fertile ground for the birth and the development of a "worldly citizen"? This question is one of the major challenges that cosmopolitan thinking has to face. Although some of the contributors raise the issue, notably Simon Keller, there are no clear answers yet to this question. As a new venue for research, studies on cosmopolitanism should be open to interdisciplinary studies. Indeed, if one goal of cosmopolitanism is the implementation of its duties and norms, the question of their feasibility must be answered. In this case, we need to know what are the social traits of such an enlightened human being. Sociological work on diasporas or psychological studies on the responses of individuals to a situation of multiple allegiances could contribute to this normative enquiry. Eventually, as they would give indications about what is a possible world citizen, these studies could also inform us about the nature of cosmopolitanism as a normative framework.

Given the attention (whether deserved or not) that this question has been given in the wider social sciences and the humanities, it is surprising that this volume does not tackle the question of the universality of norms. To what extent is the Western cosmopolitan ideal universal? Should our traditional vision of cosmopolitanism be influenced by some alternative visions of supranational morality, and how would this global debate on cosmopolitanism take place? The critique of the Western-centrism of cosmopolitanism needs to be addressed, as the fear of undue relativism should also be overcome. Finding the appropriate answers to this objection is one of the hurdles that cosmopolitan authors have to overcome in order to make themselves heard beyond their own circles. After a transitional phase of mid-life crisis, cosmopolitanism would then finally enter the age of maturity.

Colonomos, A. (2008). Moralizing International Relations: Called to Account. Palgrave MacMillan.

Katzenstein, P. (ed.) (1996). The Culture of National Security: Norms and Identity in World Politics. Columbia University Press.

Price, R. M. (2008). Moral Limit and Possibility in World Politics. Cambridge University Press.