Cosmos in the Ancient World

Cosmos In The Ancient World Thinned

Philip Sidney Horky (ed.), Cosmos in the Ancient World, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 348pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108423649.

Reviewed by Daryn Lehoux, Queen's University


The Greek word cosmos spans a famously broad and fascinating cluster of meanings. One morning I thought to look for some insight by checking its root meanings in Robert Beekes' Etymological Dictionary of Greek. As it turns out, the deep history of the word is (perhaps fittingly) rather obscure. The current, "most probable" speculation ties it to a Proto-Indo-European root word that, if this account is correct, would have also given us the Latin censeo, 'to assess, hold as an opinion, recommend.' Beekes further gestures at what appear to be plausible Old Church Slavonic, Old Persian, and Sanskrit cognates that have to do with speaking and praising, a Middle Welsh verb for pointing something out, and to a postfix in Greek and Sanskrit for measuring or apportioning (the -κάς in ἑκάς and ἀνδρακάς). He concludes that "the original meaning was probably 'to put in order (by speaking).'"[1]

Imagine my surprise, now, when in the middle of this very search I received an email from Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews to ask if I might review Philip Sidney Horky's anthology -- sensing a cosmic coincidence if there ever was one, I agreed, and am very glad that I did so.

This volume is simply a wonderful collection of essays that does real justice to the many fascinating intersections, byways, and difficult puzzles that emerge from the bountiful and intersecting resonances of cosmos in Greek. Well known to readers of philosophy as the word for 'world,' or 'universe,' specialists will know that this usage of cosmos is ultimately metaphorical, at least in its earliest attestations, having emerged from an earlier sense of 'something adorned' or 'decorated,' connected again by semantic stretch from its older 'ordering-things-in-speeches' sense. And anyone with an ear attuned to the confluence of rhetoric and politics (or perhaps of societal order and good government) will be interested to learn that from a very early date the word was also the name of a chief magistracy in Crete, or that Thucydides used cosmos to mean 'government' more generally.

Horky has organized the volume into four interconnected sections. Following his introduction, the first section covers the uses (and the doxographically purported uses) of cosmos in cosmology and cosmogony in more-or-less its most familiar senses; the second section looks at cosmos in ethical and political contexts; the third at the broad interplays that cosmos has in Greek and Latin culture (specifically theatre, augury, architecture); and the fourth at ideas of the cosmic sublime and cosmic themes in theology (two chapters). The volume closes with a thoughtful afterword by Victoria Wohl.

The section on cosmology and cosmogony features four chapters. The first is by Horky himself on the importance of attending to uses of cosmos, and of distinguishing between uses that are more centred on themes of orderliness in the world as opposed to uses that name the world or the world-order as the cosmos. He argues that the ancient tradition attributing cosmos-as-world-order to Pythagoras, or the modern ones attributing it to one or the other of the pre-Empedoclean Presocratics, are probably mistaken. Instead, through a careful reading of the doxographical evidence, and then the testimonies in Xenophon and Plato, Horky sees Empedocles as the clearest innovator here, with some promising evidence pointing to important themes in Archytas and Philolaus.

Arnauld Macé follows this chapter with a literary-philosophical argument that would situate Parmenides as a key figure in opening up the possibility of describing the universe as a cosmos in epic verse (Empedocles' medium), through an interplay between themes of organizing lines of verse (cosmos as ordering speech) and claims about the organization of the world as a whole (cosmos as the object sung in the poem), where the picture of the world described is always modeled on human understandings of social orders (cosmos in a political sense). This all happens via a linkage between the truth of well-chosen words, the truths of the world they purport to describe -- albeit in this case deceptively -- and the models that humans have available to them for describing divine things.

Malcolm Schofield, in his investigation of the use of the word diacosmesis, the act of arranging or organizing a cosmos, rather casually dispenses with Horky's and Macé's versions of the history of the word (it happens only very briefly and in a footnote: "following e.g., Kahn 1960 . . . for an alternative view, see . . . ") to treat diacosmesis as the act of arranging, specifically, the world. He thus takes cosmos, contrary to the two preceding chapters, as "the standard word for a 'world' in Presocratic discourse."[2] For all that, what emerges is an interesting and novel argument about a possible back-and-forth among mid-to-late fifth century Presocratics around the concept of diacosmesis, with possible antecedents a little earlier (Heraclitus and Parmenides). I take Schofield's conclusion to be at least somewhat tentative when he puts it that "the issue turns out to encapsulate the basics of a good deal of the entire history of Presocratic thinking." But this is a big claim, and if he is right, then Horky and Macé are surely wrong -- an invitation to further work if ever there was one.

Moving to Aristotle, Monte Ransome Johnson's contribution makes a tight pairing with Schofield's in many ways, but in this case arguing specifically against reading too much importance into Aristotle's use of cosmos as a concept, and indeed against seeing an actual cosmology -- a science of the cosmos in particular -- in Aristotle. Again this is a rather significant and novel claim and it rests on a close reading of Aristotle's terminology in the Physics, the De caelo, and the Meteorology, where, Johnson argues, even when Aristotle does use cosmos to refer to the regions above or around us, he (almost?) always means something more limited than the universe as a whole.

Opening the section on ethical and political uses of cosmos, George Boys-Stones argues that Plato should be seen as a natural-law ethicist, insofar as his idea of the good for individual moral actors derives from the part they play in the cosmos as a whole. Boyes-Stones' centerpoint for doing so is an argument against the usual reading of Plato as emphasizing an ethical distinction between inner beauty and (possibly ugly) outer form, and instead showing how inner beauty manifests in public action such that it perhaps counterintuitively creates a more beautiful outer form. This relies on a re-emphasis of the moral agent as a soul-body combination (an idea that will come back in Pauliina Remes' chapter) acting and interacting as part of a responsive cosmos.

Staying with Plato, Luc Brisson looks at Plato's Laws and the relationship between a city's laws, the rationality of its lawmakers, and the success, morality, and desirability of the city, with its various cosmic resonances (cosmos as political order, cosmos in mathematico-harmonic-astronomical arrangements, cosmos as world order). The city thus models or imitates important features of its situation in the rationally-ordered, Timaean whole. Here we see the kinds of disparate ideas covered by cosmos that opened the initial discussion of the book coming together in a deliberately wrought, integrated picture of individual, city, law, and world-order as a whole.

Remes' chapter offers a clear and interesting account of the importance of cosmology to Plotinus' theory of ethical human action. As Boys-Stones had also noted, human action always takes place in -- and in interaction with -- the world, and Remes shows how this fact, combined with features of Plotinian cosmology, theology, and metaphysics interact to produce a unique moral theory. As in many other papers in the volume, careful consideration of the roles that parts play in wholes is key, as are the precise nature and limitations of the metaphysical identity that runs between the human body-soul and the cosmos as a whole.

Opening the lens to Greek culture more widely, Carol Atack zooms out to look at analogies between cosmos and the polis in poets, historians, orators, and dramatists to track changes in how the analogy was wielded and conceived in the Greek classical period. She argues that Plato's account in the Laws and the Timaeus-Critias borrows from and builds on interesting reconceptions of cosmos that were well underway in the broader political and rhetorical cultures of the day.

Renaud Gagné continues this focus on Greek cultures to explore choral metaphors of cosmic motions in Greek theatre and poetry, thinking through literary examples from the classical era to late antiquity, and Robert Germany follows this with a study of overlaps between Roman theatre and augury, with its central idea of temples in the sky opened for divine communication. Gilles Sauron closes the section with an interesting chapter on cosmic and astronomical-astrological themes in Roman architecture, focusing primarily on 'private' spaces (at least insofar as upper-class spaces meant to impress select guests could be considered private). I found Sauron's chapter particularly interesting for the light it sheds on the rapidly growing popularity of astronomy-astrology among Roman elites in the first few centuries CE.

Coming now to the closing section of the book, we find W. H. Shearin's examination of the contrasts between Stoic and Epicurean sensibilities of the sublime and its modes of instantiation in the cosmos, through a comparison between Lucretius and Seneca's Natural Questions. I should say that the Natural Questions is one of my favourite Stoic texts, and it is lovely to see it here given its due as a rich, if subtle and sometimes diffuse, source of natural and ethical philosophy. Following this is Horky's third chapter in the volume (including the introduction) which looks at a broad range of ancient ideas of cosmic order and action that center on the very diverse meanings of another polyvalent Greek word, pneuma. Horky innovatively moves between theological traditions spanning Pythagoreanism, Stoicism, Judaism, and early Christianity.

Tying a bow around the wide-ranging interwoven themes of the book is an insightful and well-framed afterword by Wohl. Errors and inconsistencies in the volume are exceptionally few (I spotted only a small disagreement between Schofield and Johnson about how many instances of the word diacosmesis occur in Aristotle's genuine works, plus one minor typo in a footnote [parantellon for paranatellon, p. 241, n. 25]).

All in all this is a nicely produced and smartly curated collection. A well-ordered, well-adorned, and above all welcome addition to the literature.


[1] Beekes, R., with the assistance of L. van Beek (2010) Etymological Dictionary of Greek, Leiden, Brill.

[2] See p. 65 and its n. 8.