Could There Have Been Nothing? Against Metaphysical Nihilism

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Geraldine Coggins, Could There Have Been Nothing? Against Metaphysical Nihilism, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 171pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230573635.

Reviewed by Kelly Trogdon, Lingnan University


According to metaphysical nihilism, it's possible that there are no concrete objects. In other words, there is a possible world w such that "There are no concrete objects" is true at w. The central argument for the thesis is the subtraction argument. Though there are different versions of the argument in the literature, the following simple version will do for our purposes: There is a possible world w1 accessible from the actual world such that (i) w1 has a finite number of concrete objects, x1, x2, . . . xn, and (ii) the non-existence of any one of the xs doesn't require that any other concrete object exist. Hence, we can "subtract" x1 from w1 and arrive at a world, w2, whose concrete objects are x2, . . . xn. Further iterations of this procedure eventually bring us to a singleton world, wn, with xn as its sole concrete object. A final iteration delivers an empty world -- a world with no concrete objects. Accessibility is transitive, so this empty world is possible with respect to the actual world. Hence, metaphysical nihilism is true.

The goal of Coggins' book is fairly modest: after clarifying metaphysical nihilism, the subtraction argument, and related issues, she aims to show that the subtraction argument fails. Her argument is essentially that the subtraction argument doesn't take into account a certain view concerning essences that, if true, blocks the inference from the existence of wn to the empty world described above. In what follows I'll give you a sense of what's at issue in each chapter and voice various worries along the way. In the end I suspect that the metaphysical nihilist won't be too troubled by Coggins' argument.

The first chapter contains a general discussion of the distinction between metaphysical nihilism and anti-nihilism. Here Coggins distinguishes between two versions of anti-nihilism. The first is committed to the de re claim that there is an individual that exists necessarily, the second the de dicto claim that it's necessary that some concrete object or other exists. Coggins ultimately focuses on the second variety of anti-nihilism.

In the second chapter Coggins reviews different ways of casting the subtraction argument. As she notes, some versions of the argument (like the one I presented above) require that there are possible worlds with a finite number of concrete objects. She points out that, if unit sets are concrete, then any world containing one concrete object contains an infinite number of them (on the assumption that, for any concrete object, there is a unit set with that object as its member). Baldwin [1996], a proponent of metaphysical nihilism, argues that unit sets aren't concrete, so there is no problem here. He claims that (i) an object is concrete just in case it violates the identity of indiscernibles cast in terms of intrinsic properties; and (ii) unit sets adhere to the principle. The defense of (ii), adjusted to avoid certain problems, is this: {x} has the intrinsic property of having x as its sole member, and if {y} has this property, then {x} = {y}.

Coggins agrees that there are possible worlds with a finite number of concrete objects. But, following Rodriguez-Pereyra [1997], she argues that Baldwin's response to the problem of unit sets is flawed, for the property of having x as your sole member is relational, and all relational properties are extrinsic. This, however, is a mistake. Having legs longer than arms, for example, is obviously an intrinsic relational property.[i] As we will see, Coggins has trouble with intrinsic properties in the fourth chapter as well.

Central to the third chapter is a taxonomy of conceptions of possible worlds: the compositional view (possible worlds -- themselves concrete objects -- are either composed of or constituted by other concrete objects), the container view (possible worlds -- perhaps they're concrete, perhaps abstract -- instead "contain" concrete objects), and ersatzism (possible worlds are abstract representational vehicles or sets of such entities). Coggins argues that, of the three, only ersatzism so understood both has a real chance of being correct and is compatible with metaphysical nihilism. On ersatzism a possible world with no concrete objects is a representational vehicle whose content is that there are no concrete objects.

In the fourth chapter Coggins presents various desiderata for an account of the concrete/abstract distinction and argues that the spatiotemporal account (an entity is concrete just in case it's spatiotemporal) best meets them. Given her discussion in the third chapter, metaphysical nihilism then becomes the view that there is an ersatz world according to which there are no spatiotemporal objects.

Two problems with her discussion of the concrete/abstract distinction are as follows. The first concerns her rejection of the identity of indiscernibles account mentioned above. Her chief reason for rejecting it is that in her view it's "plagued" by philosophical problems about intrinsicality (74). But what is the trouble with intrinsicality supposed to be? Coggins' view here seems to be that the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction is not well understood. Now, it's true that there is no consensus on the correct account of the distinction, but we nevertheless have a strong facility with the concept of intrinsicality in the sense that we confidently apply it and tend to converge in our judgments on which properties are intrinsic and which are extrinsic. Moreover, the distinction is central to various philosophical debates concerning, for example, intrinsic value, narrow content, and genuine change. So I don't see what the special problem about intrinsicality in the context of metaphysical nihilism comes to.

The second problem is that at various points Coggins uses the following as a guide to whether a given entity is concrete: would adding it to an empty world render that world non-empty? But remember that for Coggins a possible world is empty just in case it's a possible world with no concrete objects. Given the directness of the circularity we're operating with here (something that Coggins herself makes note of), I don't see how to get any mileage whatsoever out of this procedure.

In the fifth chapter Coggins revisits the subtraction argument, considering it in the light of the results of the previous chapters. A central part of this chapter is the suggestion that Lowe's [1998] and [2005] work on existential dependence has important implications for the debate concerning metaphysical nihilism. Coggins focuses in particular on Lowe's rigid existential dependence (dependenceR) and generic existential dependence (dependenceG). According to Lowe, x dependsR (for its existence) on y just in case it's necessary that if x exists then y exists; and x dependsG (for its existence) on the Fs just in case it's necessary that, if x exists, then some F exists. Coggins recommends that we think of anti-nihilism as the view that possible worlds either dependR or dependG on concrete objects, and nihilism the view that denies this.[ii] So the question "Is it possible that there are no concrete objects?" becomes "Do possible worlds either dependR or dependG on concrete objects?"

Given that Lowe's conception of existential dependence is purely modal in character, Coggins' suggestion in effect seems to be that our formulations of nihilism and anti-nihilism would benefit from modal prefaces. Let me explain. Before the talk of existential dependence, our formulation of (one version of) anti-nihilism was something like this: for any possible world w, there is some concrete object or other in w. Given that existential dependence is purely modal in character, when we say, for example, that possible worlds dependG on concrete objects, what we're really saying seems to be that it's necessary that, for any possible world w, there is some concrete object or other in w. Of course, the claim with the modal preface trivially follows from the original claim. What the new formulation of anti-nihilism does, then, is simply highlight a trivial consequence of the original formulation. Hence, it's unclear what is to be gained by adopting the new formulation.

In the sixth and final chapter Coggins argues that the subtraction argument fails. The gist of the argument as I see it is as follows. Following Fine [1994], it's an essential truth about α that φ just in case it's part of what it is to be α that φ. The essential truths with respect to α specify those features that bear, in the metaphysically significant sense of the phrase, on what α is; these properties are essential to (alternatively, part of the essence of) α. Assuming that possible worlds have essences, a coherent view is this: for any possible world w, an essential truth about w is that "Some concrete object or other exists" is true at w. And assuming that abstract objects have essences, another coherent view is this: for any abstract object a, it's an essential truth about a that, for any world w, if "a exists" is true at w, then "Some concrete object or other exists" is also true at w. A consequence of both views (assuming that there is an abstract object that exists necessarily) is that there is no empty possible world. These views, if true, block the inference from singleton worlds to empty worlds in the subtraction argument.[iii]

I find this argument persuasive as far as it goes. Though Coggins herself offers a defense of neither view concerning essential truths described above, they're coherent and need to be addressed in arguing for metaphysical nihilism. I suspect that advocates of the view, however, won't be too worried about this. Consider, for example, how the proposal about essential truths concerning possible worlds goes on the ersatz view. Presumably the idea in this case is that, if w is an abstract object of the appropriate type, then it's an essential truth about w that its content include that there is some concrete object. I'm not sure what would recommend such a view. Moreover, Fine's conception of essence itself is quite controversial in any case, and Coggins doesn't defend it here. Supplemented with a premise to the effect that this conception of essence is ultimately to be rejected (a premise, I suspect, that the metaphysical nihilist, along with many others, may antecedently accept anyway), the subtraction argument, for all Coggins has shown, is in good order.

This brings me to a final thought that is friendly to the project. Rather than focusing on Fine's essential truths or Lowe's existential dependence relations, perhaps it would be more useful in this context to appeal to the notion of ground (one similar to a notion Lowe [2005] calls "explanatory existential dependence" that he considers but ultimately rejects). Grounding enthusiasts tend to agree that this notion is to be analyzed neither in purely modal terms nor in terms of the notion of essence; indeed, it is typically taken as primitive (cf. Fine [2001], Rosen [2010], and Schaffer [2009]). In this case, anti-nihilism would be the thesis that the facts concerning the existence and nature of possible worlds are grounded in facts concerning the existence and nature of concrete objects; nihilism would be the denial of this. And Coggins' objection to the subtraction argument would be that it doesn't address the view that, say, the fact that abstract objects exist in a world w is grounded in the fact that some concrete object or other exists in w.[iv]


Baldwin, T. 1996. 'There Might Be Nothing,' Analysis 56/4: 231-238.

Fine, K. 1994. 'Essence and Modality,' Philosophical Perspectives 8: 1-16.

Fine, K. 2001. 'The Question of Realism,' Philosophers' Imprint 1/2: 1-30.

Langton, R. and D. Lewis. 1998. 'Defining "Intrinsic",' Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 58/2: 333-354.

Lowe, E. J. 1998. The Possibility of Metaphysics: Substance, Identity, and Time. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Lowe, E. J. 2005. 'Ontological Dependence,' Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Rodriguez-Pereyra, G. 1997. 'There Might Be Nothing: The Subtraction Argument Improved,' Analysis 57/3: 159-166.

Rosen, G. 2010. 'Metaphysical Dependence: Grounding and Reduction,' in (eds.) R. Hale and A. Hoffman, Modality: Metaphysics, Logic, and Epistemology (Oxford UP), pp. 109-136.

Schaffer, J. 2009. 'On What Grounds What,' in (eds.) D. Chalmers et al, Metametaphysics (Oxford UP), pp. 347-283.

[i] Coggins cites Langton and Lewis's [1998] important discussion of intrinsicality in this context, apparently without realizing that it classifies various relational properties as intrinsic.

[ii] In particular, Coggins casts the view that there is a concrete necessary existent in terms of dependenceR, and the view that it's necessary that there is some concrete object or other in terms of dependenceG.

[iii] It's worth noting that the argument could also be cast in terms of the Lowe-style relation of essential generic existential dependence (dependenceEG): x dependsEG (for its existence) on the Fs just in case it's part of the essence of x that if x exists then some F exists.

[4] Thanks to Sam Cowling and Timmy Fuller for helpful discussion.