Counterfactuals and Probability

Placeholder book cover

Moritz Schulz, Counterfactuals and Probability, Oxford University Press, 236pp., $70.00, ISBN 9780198785958.

Reviewed by Holger Andreas, University of British Columbia


This is an exciting investigation of the semantics of counterfactuals that I highly recommend to both experts and people who want to catch up with recent results in the literature. It addresses both epistemic and metaphysical aspects of counterfactuals, and develops a novel refinement of the standard semantics. After a brief description of the scope of the investigation, I will describe and discuss this refinement in greater detail. I leave out certain other topics that are not in the central focus of the study, such as the issue of triviality.

The study is about uncertain counterfactuals. Of particular interest are counterfactuals for which we have a high degree of belief, but which fail to come out true on the standard semantics. This semantics is taken to go as follows (p. 9):

Standard Semantics. Let ϕ and ψ be sentences. A counterfactual ⌜ϕ > ψ⌝ is true at a world w iff ψ is true at all relevant ϕ-worlds with respect to w.

The standard semantics, thus, is based on Lewis [6], without commitment to a similarity ordering of possible words. A related minor deviation from the general semantics of Lewis [6] is the assumption that there always is a set of relevant antecedent worlds, so that infinite chains of evermore relevant worlds are excluded.

As is well known, the standard semantics has been criticised for various reasons. A major concern has been the question of how we come to determine the genuine similarity ordering of possible worlds and the appropriate notion of relevance. Another problem arises for probabilistic conditional assertions of the following type:

Probably, had A occurred, B would have occurred as well.

Suppose there has been a fair lottery of which Moritz did not buy a single ticket. Yet, he wonders what would have happened, had he bought one. Further, suppose there are 1000 tickets of which only one wins. Moritz is rational enough to know that his chances of winning would have been quite low. So, he holds:

Probably, had I bought a ticket, my ticket would have lost.

Now, let us take a look at the truth conditions of the conditional in the scope of the operator probably:

(C) Had I bought a ticket, my ticket would have lost.

In a simplified semantic account, there are 999 relevant antecedent worlds in which Moritz loses and only one where he wins. (This account is simplified insofar as - on a realist interpretation of the standard semantics - the possible worlds must be fine-grained, i.e., encompassing all kinds of aspects that are not relevant at all to the conditional, such as the weather tomorrow, the results of the football league, etc.) It seems as if these numbers were to support the above probabilistic statement. Note, however, that there is at least one relevant antecedent world in which Moritz wins the lottery. Hence, he knows - for certain - that the standard truth conditions of (C) do not obtain. Thus, Moritz has a high degree of justification for (C), while being certain that the truth conditions of (C) do not obtain. Why is this observation troublesome? If we look at non-probabilistic counterfactuals, the following principle seems to hold:

If we know ϕ, then we must also know that the truth conditions of ϕ obtain.

This gives rise to the following puzzle (p. 104):

(J) It is possible to possess a degree of justification less than 1 for c [where c is a conditional] without being justified (not even indirectly) to the same or higher degree that the corresponding standard truth conditions obtain.

(K) It is not possible to know c without being in a position to know that the corresponding standard truth conditions obtain.

(J) suggests that counterfactuals do not possess standard truth conditions, while (K) indicates the opposite. If (C) were to possess standard truth conditions, we could transfer the high degree of justification of (C) to the meta-proposition that the truth conditions of (C) obtain. Schulz argues in detail and quite convincingly why the conflict between (J) and (K) is pressing and needs to be resolved. The puzzle itself originates from an observation on indicative conditionals in Edgington [3].

What shall we do?  Schulz discusses two alternatives to a truth-conditional semantics of conditionals: (i) the restrictor view by Kratzer [5], and (ii) an epistemic dynamic semantics along the lines of Veltman [9]. The restrictor view is discussed at greater length, but not favoured because of problems with embedding conditionals. The author thinks that such problems also arise for the dynamic epistemic semantics, but does not argue for this claim. The restrictor view and the epistemic dynamic semantics, thus, remain " fall-back" options in the eyes of the author.

At this point, the author's novel contribution is developed. Schulz wants to hold on to the view that counterfactuals have truth conditions, while he thinks that the above standard semantics needs refinement. His proposed semantics makes essential use of Hilbert's epsilon terms. An epsilon term may be described as a non-unique description operator:

𝜀x ϕ(x)

which stands for some arbitrary object x that satisfies the propositional form ϕ(x). A fully-fledged semantics of epsilon terms can be given in terms of choice functions, first introduced by Asser [1]. The intuition behind epsilon terms is that such a term picks an arbitrary object out of a set of objects (which is described by a propositional form ϕ(x)). Having introduced epsilon terms, Schulz proposes the following refinement of the standard semantics (p. 154):

Epsilon-based Truth Conditions. Let w be any world and ⌜ϕ > ψ⌝ a counterfactual. Then
w ⊨ ⌜ϕ >ψ⌝ iff . . .

In words: A counterfactual is true at a world w if either there is no relevant antecedent world or, if
there is one, the consequent is true at the arbitrarily selected relevant antecedent-world (relative to w).

A further refinement of this semantics, then, consists in assigning weights to the relevant antecedent worlds. The weight of a given relevant antecedent world is based on the objective, metaphysical chance of this world to become realized given the truth of the antecedent. To see the motivation behind this, think of throwing a loaded die. The relevant antecedent worlds are then not equally probable.

The epsilon-based semantics does in fact resolve the above puzzle about probabilistic counterfactuals, at least on a realist construal of the choice function that actually picks an object out of a given set. To see this more clearly, let us return to the lottery. The choice function is not something we have any knowledge about. (More generally, a choice function seems to be utterly epistemically inaccessible.) Since, however, there are 1000 equally weighted relevant antecedent worlds of which 999 are such that Moritz's ticket will lose, it is quite probable that the process of arbitrarily selecting one world out of this set yields one in which Moritz's ticket actually loses. Hence, it is quite probable, though not certain, that the truth conditions of the counterfactual (C) obtain. And all of a sudden, our degree of justification of the counterfactual (C) is in harmony with our estimation as to whether or not the truth conditions of (C) obtain.

Schulz favours a realist construal of the choice function, but thinks that his proposal is not committed to such an interpretation. This is one of the very few claims of the study that are not worked out well and that are, to my mind, mistaken. The author argues that an antirealist construal of the choice function can be made coherent if supplemented with a super-valuationist semantics. Then, we have to chose between two notions of truth: super-truth and sub-truth. A sentence ϕ is super-true iff it is true in all supervaluations of a given classical, partial valuation. Sub-truth, by contrast, is defined as truth in at least one such super-valuation. All of this is well explained, but the application to choice functions is not worked out so well, as can be seen from what follows.

If we apply the distinction between sub- and super-truth to choice functions, we obtain the following distinction:

1. A sentence ϕ (which contains epsilon terms) is true in a structure M iff ϕ is true in M for all choice functions.

2. A sentence ϕ (which contains epsilon terms) is true in a structure M iff ϕ is true in M for at least one choice function.

Meyer Viol [7] has explicated these two notions of truth, referring to them, respectively, as generic and local truth. The structure M represents the objects of the possible world in question and their real properties.

With either notion of truth, we run into a severe problem for the above semantics of counterfactuals. For, clearly, if we go for generic truth, we fall back to the original problem: we know, for certain, that the truth-conditions of (C) do not obtain. There is one choice function that picks out a world in which Moritz wins the lottery after all. If, by contrast, we prefer to understand truth (in the context of epsilon terms) as local truth, the consequences are even less desirable. For, then, we know, for certain, that the truth conditions of flatly contradicting counterfactuals obtain. For example, we know then that the truth conditions of both 'Had Moritz bought a ticket, he would have won the lottery' and 'Had Moritz bought a ticket, his ticket would have lost' obtain. This is not necessarily absurd, but leads to a paraconsistent logic and semantics (see, e.g., Da Costa et al. [2]). Neither practically nor theoretically does it seem advisable to adopt such a semantics of counterfactuals. Thus, it is only the estimation of credences of (C) that continues to go well in the super-valuationist setting. The estimation of whether truth conditions obtain goes wrong for (C) and the class of counterfactuals in question.

So, what is a choice function if we are to interpret it realistically? Such a function seems to be even fancier and more remote from epistemic access than Lewis's similarity ordering. Schulz is witty enough to refer to gambling semantic gods when he comes to explaining the nature of the choice function (p. 163). Admittedly, the tricky epistemic access might not be a problem since there certainly are many situations where we are, in principle, not able to determine whether or not the truth conditions of a counterfactual obtain.

Let me conclude with an observation on objective chances and determinism. Arguably, the choice function figures as a hidden variable. If we knew it, we would know a lot, perhaps too much. Particularly so, if we adopt an epsilon-based semantics for indicative conditionals. The author entertains the thought of adopting such a semantics at the end of his study (p. 221):

Possible Truth Conditions for Indicatives. Let w be any world and ⌜ϕ → ψ⌝ an indicative conditional. Then w ⊨ ⌜ϕ → ψ⌝ iff . . .

According to these truth conditions, an indicative conditional is vacuously true iff its antecedent is epistemically impossible. Otherwise, it is true iff the consequent is true at an arbitrarily selected epistemically possible antecedent-world (relative to w).

If we were to know the choice function, we could abuse it to predict accurately any future event, including the precise weather in four weeks, the result of elections, football matches, etc. Notably, we could also predict whether or not a particular atom of a radioactive substance will decay at a certain time. For, if we use some ϕ of which we know it is true in our world, then ⌜ϕ > ψ⌝ and ψ must have the same truth value in our world. If there are irrelevant counterfactual conditionals for any consequent ψ (where the antecedent ϕ is true in our world and has not the slightest impact on ψ), we could also use the epsilon-based semantics of counterfactuals to predict what is going to happen in our world. Of course, we cannot epistemically access the choice function, but the semantics gods can. That is, there seems to be an epistemic perspective upon the possible worlds from which a possible world unfolds strictly deterministically, even though this perspective need not be sub specie aeternitatis.

If a strict determinism follows from the epsilon-based semantics, how can we understand the notion of objective (metaphysical) chance? There is very little discussion in the book on determinism and objective chances. Some reference are made to Glynn [4] and Skyrms [8], but these do not help address the problem. Glynn [4], for example, retains indeterminism at the most fundamental physical level. If, however, we are good realists, taking the epsilon-based semantics seriously and at face value, there does not seem to remain any indeterminism -- not even at the most fundamental physical level. The determination is brought about not directly by laws of nature, but by the choice function and a realist distinction between relevant and non-relevant antecedent worlds.

Is realism about choice functions, then, consistent with the well-established result that there are no hidden variables for certain quantum-mechanical processes? This question should be addressed in further research on the proposed semantics -- particularly in light of objective chances being rooted in Popper's propensity interpretation of probability. For, this interpretation is in turn motivated by genuinely indeterministic quantum-mechanical processes.

This said, the book remains a well written and original study that merits reading from various perspectives. Proponents of epistemic approaches to counterfactuals will, probably, find reasons to further pursue and to strengthen such an approach. More metaphysically realist minded philosophers will, most probably, find it rewarding to take up the challenge of further working out the intricate relations between determinism, objective chances, and choice functions.


[1] Asser, G. (1957). Theorie der logischen Auswahlfunktionen. Zeitschrift für mathematische Logik und Grundlagen der Mathematik 3:30-68.

[2] Da Costa, N., Bueno, O., and French, S. (1998). The Logic of Pragmatic Truth. Journal of Philosophical Logic 27: 603-620.

[3] Edgington, D. (1995). On Conditionals. Mind 104(414): 235-329.

[4] Glynn, L. (2010). Deterministic Chance. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 61(1): 51-80.

[5] Kratzer, A. (2012). Modals and Conditionals: New and Revised Perspectives. Oxford Studies in Theoretical Linguistics, Oxford.

[6] Lewis, D. (1973). Counterfactuals. Blackwell.

[7] Meyer Viol, W. P. M. (1995). Instantial Logic. An Investigation into Reasoning with Instances. ILLC Dissertation Series 1995-11, ILLC,Amsterdam.

[8] Skyrms, B. (1980). Causal Necessity: A Pragmatic Investigation of the Necessity of Laws. Yale University Press.

[9] Veltman, F. (2005). Making Counterfactual Assumptions. Journal of Semantics 22(2): 159-180.