Country Path Conversations

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Martin Heidegger, Country Path Conversations, Bret W. Davis (tr.), Indiana University Press, 2010, 208 pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780253354693.

Reviewed by Iain Thomson, University of New Mexico


Heidegger wrote these rich, fascinating, and deeply hopeful philosophical dialogues in the middle of what was probably the darkest period in his life. The time between November 1944 and February 1946 centered around Germany's defeat in the Second World War.  It began with the 55 year-old Heidegger's conscription into the Volkssturm or German Territorial Army (along with all the other remaining German men between the ages of 16 and 60), where he spent several exhausting weeks digging trenches in the Alsace region between Germany and France (as the Nazis desperately sought to defend their borders from advancing Allied troops). It ended with Heidegger's dismissal from Freiburg University by the French de-Nazification committee and his subsequent psychiatric hospitalization for depression. In the interval, Heidegger supervised the hiding of his voluminous philosophical manuscripts in a cave (after the bank where they had been stored in a vault was reduced to rubble by an Allied air raid on Messkirch); his two sons both went missing in action in Russia (and became captives in Russian prisoner of war camps); his two year-old love affair with Princess Margot of Saxony-Meiningen came to threaten his marriage (when his wife Elfride demanded he choose between them; Heidegger chose Elfride but the Prince and Princess were divorced in 1947); and he lost drawn-out trials with the local and French de-Nazification committees. All these stressful events, especially the last two, precipitated the depressive crisis for which he was hospitalized.

And yet there was also a brief period of calm in the eye of this storm. As soon as Heidegger was discharged from the Volkssturm in December (for the recurrent "heart problems" that now look like psychosomatic symptoms of severe anxiety), he fled on his son's bicycle from the city of Freiburg (where he lived and taught) to his hometown of Messkirch (some 75 miles away!) so as to stay out of the grasp of the French Army. Heidegger spent the next few months writing in Messkirch and teaching at the nearby Wildenstein Castle (an idyllic site high in the hills above Beuron, with a panoramic view of the Danube river valley below), where has was soon joined by what remained of Freiburg University's philosophy department. The philosophy faculty taught joint seminars to about 30 women students and also helped the local farmers bring in their hay harvest in order to earn their own keep (food and other necessities being extremely scarce).

Heidegger felt truly in his element here, and even planned to have one of the towers of Wildenstein Castle restored with hopes of working there in close proximity to the Princess. (He paid a year's rent on the tower but the shortage of laborers and materials made the project impossible to complete at the time. Still, the romantic, Hölderlinian idea of living and working in a tower looms large in the second of these dialogues, "The Teacher Meets the Tower Warden [or, better, the Tower Dweller] at the Door of the Tower Stairway."[1]) While lecturing primarily on Heraclitus and Hölderlin, on such timely topics as the spiritual riches that material poverty can help disclose, Heidegger also discovered Daoism (recognizing profound affinities with his own views, on the basis of which he hoped one day to conduct a dialogue with the East).[2] It was during this temporary reprieve -- a brief stay (or Aufenthalte) in the midst of intense historical, political, and psychological turmoil -- that Heidegger wrote his first philosophical dialogues, the Country Path Conversations. In them, the thinker seeks to make sense of some of the troubling events through which he was living by placing them in the broader context of the "history of being," that is, his growing understanding of the way metaphysics focuses and transforms Western humanity's basic sense of what it means to be.

In what began as an apparently hypomanic frenzy of productivity, Heidegger completed two dialogues (a long and quite brilliant one that gives shape to his emerging sense of his post-War role as a "guide" to thinking through the historical moment, and a short and politically problematic one clearly inspired by the fate of his sons), and he wrote part of another (a short and highly mysterious one that turns around his Hölderlinian idea of the tower -- and remains similarly undeveloped). In a letter to Elfride (of 23 March 1945), Heidegger tellingly describes their inception:

This Easter greeting is full of sorrow. And yet we must not succumb to it. The fate of the Fatherland is so enigmatic, in the midst of that which merely happens, that it must harbor within it something that towers [ragt] far beyond our knowledge. From this painful mystery comes wonderful strength. Even though my condition is still delicate physically, in the last few days I have gained such uncanny momentum that I am almost completely oblivious to food and sleep. I suddenly found a form of saying that I would never have dared use, if only because of the danger of superficially imitating the Platonic dialogues. I am working on a "Conversation" [Gespräch]; actually I have the "inspiration" -- I really have to call it this -- for several at once. Poetic and thoughtful saying have won an originary unity here, and everything flows along easily and freely.[3]

The philosophical dialogues Heidegger refers to here have now been nicely translated into English (two for the first time and the other for the first time in its entirety) by Bret Davis as Country Path Conversations (Feldweg-Gespräche).[4]

Heidegger calls these dialogues "Conversations," Gespräche, in order to suggest the surprising and illuminating ways in which language (Sprache) works to gather (Ge-) a meaningful world together for those who, like the characters in his dialogues, carefully attend to the matter guiding their discussion as it both comes to and eludes their words. As the Heideggerian figure of "the Guide" tells us in the first "conversation":

In an authentic conversation an event takes place wherein something comes to language. . . . [Such a] conversation first waits upon reaching that of which it speaks. And the speakers of a conversation can speak in this sense only if they are prepared for something to befall them in the conversation which transforms their own essence. (36-7)

In Heidegger's view, an authentic conversation about something cannot be forced, controlled, or steered along some predetermined course toward a desired destination, as one might follow a paved road. Instead, the conversation should follow the impetus that emerges from the topic being discussed in whatever direction it leads, like an exploratory stroll through the countryside (or, perhaps, like an ambling dérive through the city). To follow such Country Path Conversations, Heidegger is also suggesting, we late moderns will need to recognize, undermine, and transcend some of our most basic presuppositions about the nature of self and world, presuppositions we have inherited from modern philosophy. For this kind of transformative "event" to take place in a conversation (for example, for those who initially understand themselves as conscious subjects standing over and against a domain of objects devoid of inherent worth to come to recognize a deeper level of preconceptual, pragmatic experience in which self and world are integrally entwined), the conversation needs to enact the very philosophical conversion for which it calls (so as to lead the conversation partners back beneath the subject/object dichotomy in the conversation itself). Such a transformative conversation works best, in other words, when the conversation does not just describe some philosophical insight for its readers but, instead, facilitates readers' own attainment of that insight for themselves (as an unexpected "vista" along the path), then deepens that shared insight through careful discussion.[5] It was the pursuit of such a union of form and content, expression and insight ("an originary unity" of "poetic and thoughtful saying") that led Heidegger to experiment enthusiastically with the dialogue form in Country Path Conversations.

There are moments in all three "Conversations" that approach this neo-romantic ideal, but only the first sustains it for more than a few pages at a time. One obvious problem is that reading about characters in a dialogue undergoing some transformative realization does not necessarily lead us to undergo that transformation ourselves. In order for that to happen, we would have to identify closely enough with the characters, or at least with their philosophical views and preconceptions, to find ourselves participating vicariously in the conversation. Heidegger does the best job facilitating this in the first dialogue by having his characters raise good objections (frequently ones contemporary philosophical readers are likely to have in mind), then addressing these objections clearly and often convincingly.

This first and most polished "Conversation" takes place between a "Guide," a "Scholar, and a "Scientist," and Heidegger tellingly puts these objections in the mouth of the skeptical "Scientist" character, who says such ultimately salutary things as "I find the enigmatic oppressive, not beautiful" (19), and "Your friendly mockery cannot dissuade me from asserting that what is actual is first grasped and determined by the observations of physics." (85) This scientist frequently loses the thread, tries to steer the conversation back to familiar territory or else break it off, but with the guide's subtle encouragement he persists to the end of the conversation, contributing to and sharing in its epiphanies into the nature of the relation between human beings and being as such. As the guide thus suggests: "Participating in a conversation is in fact difficult. It is even more difficult than leading a conversation" (29), since it means allowing ourselves to be led by the matter gradually emerging through the discussion. The "silent course of a conversation that moves us" is initially "inconspicuous" (76), and attending to the matter slowly taking shape in the conversation requires us to resist our usual tendency (already diagnosed by Hegel in the preface to his Phenomenology) to ignore or repress any emerging insights that fail to conform to our preexisting expectations, whether by trying to turn the conversation toward or away from certain topics, misstating or simplifying the views of our conversation partners, getting distracted by misunderstandings or side issues, or simply imposing our own pre-existing ideas (as, to be fair, even the Heideggerian "Guide" cannot always resist doing).

One is reminded here of some of Nietzsche and Freud's insights into the demands of "creativity" (which requires the ability to follow a train of thought wherever it leads), as well as Gadamer's later views on genuine "dialogue." For Heidegger, however, the point is not just psychological or hermeneutic but ontological: To be best attuned to being means to be receptive to the emergence of its inchoate possibilities, whether such ontological possibilities begin to disclose themselves in a conversation, in our relation to nature, or, better yet, in the intersection of a conversation with its natural environment. Indeed, that potentially productive intersection is a subtle but pervasive subtext of these "Conversations," which are all set in and respond to nature.

The other half of Heidegger's title (Feldweg-Gespräche) alludes to a particular Feldweg on the edge of the Black Forest, a country lane leading out from Messkirch on which Heidegger had walked, talked, read, and thought since his youth. This paradigmatic "field-path or country lane" inspires all these imagined conversations to some degree. The first conversation takes place on it; the second on a similar path near the tower; and the third, though situated in a prisoner of war camp in Russia, refers continually to a walk through the woods earlier that morning. In fact, this third exchange ("Evening Conversation: In a Prisoner of War Camp in Russia, between a Younger and an Older Man") turns around the younger man's attempt to communicate the healing epiphany which that walk through nature afforded him.

Heidegger's "Conversations" thus remain deeply personal works, but like all good phenomenology, when they work they exceed their autobiographical dimension and so contest any scientistic rejection of personal experience (as a statistically insignificant sample size, for example), showing how insights reached by an individual (in dialogue with self or others) can help illuminate important features of the paths we all walk. Most importantly, by conveying a sensitivity to the unfolding nature of things, Heidegger's conversations seek to teach a poetic receptivity to what pushes back against our pre-existing plans and designs. For, in his view, we world-disclosing human beings come into our own not by mastering and controlling an objective realm we take to be devoid of inherent worth, let alone by technologically optimizing all things, ourselves included. Instead, we come into our own when we learn creatively to disclose a texture of inherent meanings, affordances, significations, and solicitations that Heidegger thinks we can discover "all around us" (147).[6]

We touch here on that Ur-phenomenon the later Heidegger sometimes calls "being as such," a dynamic and inexhaustible ontological "abundance" or "excessiveness" that both "gives itself and refuses itself simultaneously," both informing and partly escaping all our attempts to fix it in place once and for all.[7] Unfortunately, an increasingly common misreading simply conflates Heidegger's "being as such" with Levinas's "alterity," and so misconceives being as something in principle ineffable, rather than as effable but also "inexhaustibly given to human beings to think" (156, my emphasis). The Country Path Conversations show that for a phenomenologist like Heidegger, pure ineffability or alterity is a paradoxical (if not simply contradictory) concept, because it is a concept for which there can be no convincing phenomenological evidence. Merely for something to be intelligible to us, we have to have some sense of it, in which case it will not be "infinitely other" or completely ineffable. As the "Guide" pointedly writes: "But has it really been established that the absolutely nameless is given [to us]? For us much is often ineffable, but only because its name has not yet come to us." (77)[8] He is thus particularly interested in those events of poetic "naming, in which the nameable, the name, and named bring each other into their own together [sich zumal . . . ereignen]" (ibid.). In such events of poetic sense-making, what the poetic name or concept discloses ("the named") also helps illuminate what it does not ("the nameable," that is, the not yet named), giving us some light by which we can "surmise" (96) and so continue to make sense of what might otherwise seem "unnamable."[9] In the context of this phenomenological critique of pure ineffability, I was similarly struck by what could be a one-sentence refutation of the most radically anti-anthropomorphic and "anti-correlationist" pretensions of speculative realism and object-oriented ontology: "The independence of truth from the human is after all a relation to the human" (96).

As I hope this review suggests, Heidegger's Country Path Conversations address issues at the heart of Heidegger's later thinking in evocative, provocative, and highly creative ways. I eagerly look forward to teaching the book and seeing what students make of it.

[1] Even the best translations of integrally-poetic philosophical works necessarily remain what Rick Furtak calls "admirable failures to do the impossible." (See Furtak's "Rilke and the Poetics of Revelation," translator's introduction to Rainer Maria Rilke, Sonnets to Orpheus, R. A. Furtak, trans. [Scranton: University of Scranton Press, 2007], p. 22.) For, owing to the holism of meaning, translation inevitably uproots words from the semantic web that supplied their original meanings and inserts them into another web which gives them new meanings, and this is especially true for translations of Heidegger, who deliberately exploits (what I have called) "the polysemic perversity of language," the often surprisingly semantic interconnections and fortuitous ambiguities that populate the German language, with its seemingly endless play of prefixes and suffixes affixed to verbal stems to generate new yet related semantic compounds. (See my Heidegger on Ontotheology: Technology and the Politics of Education [Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press, 2005], p. 156.) It would thus be churlish to quibble much with Davis's generally insightful, creative, and well-annotated translation, especially since Heidegger scholars will inevitably modify it in terms of their own understanding of the text (insofar as this differs from the interpretation encoded in the translation). In fact, the only choice Davis made that really bothered me was "The Tower Warden" for der Türmer, because I think Heidegger means the person who dwells in (rather than who guards) the tower -- that is, Hölderlin or, more precisely, the Hölderlin in Heidegger. Indeed, I hear this entire dialogue as a conversation between the philosopher and the poet in Heidegger (see my Heidegger, Art, and Postmodernity [Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2011], p. 115 n. 70). In other words, the figure of der Türmer personifies Heidegger's philosophical understanding of Hölderlin, and so embodies his own Hölderlinian aspirations for a future "turning" whereby we pivot beyond our late-modern understanding of being and thereby enter into a genuinely postmodern age. (If "The Tower Warden" can be heard as suggesting someone (Heidegger) who guards the truth uncovered by the tower dweller (Hölderlin), then perhaps it works, though it would then presuppose a gap between the meaning of Hölderlin's poetry, on the one hand, and Heidegger's understanding of the meaning of that poetry, on the other, a gap which Heidegger himself only rarely acknowledges.) I would thus prefer "The Tower Dweller" or simply "The Towerer," which better fits Heidegger's understanding of Hölderlin as a towering beacon capable of helping guide us through the world-historical night of nihilism into the dawn of postmodernity. (On the general point here, see also note 3 below.)

There is also one larger issue on which I would differ slightly with Davis, who writes: "I have spared no effort in attempting to make the English as clear as Heidegger's German, but have generally not tried to make my translation any more smooth or transparent than its original." (xx) I would be in favor of such a translation -- one that was clear or cloudy in the same places as the original -- if it were possible. But since translation inevitably introduces new cases of ambiguity and unclarity (as well as covering up old ones), I think it better to try to make the translation as clear as possible all the way through, trusting that those looking for the literal meaning will go back to the German anyway. Indeed, I've come full circle on this: The translation that first led me to love the later Heidegger was J. Glenn Gray's What Is Called Thinking? -- still one of the smoothest and most eloquent renditions of Heidegger's prose into English. Once I began working with the German, however, I was quite appalled by all the liberties Gray took. Yet, now I think that, for all its problems, Gray's creative attempt to do in his own poetic English what Heidegger is doing in his own poetic German yields results that remain preferable for most readers than the more literal translations toward which we Heidegger scholars seem increasingly drawn.

[2] See Hugo Ott, Martin Heidegger, A. Blunden, trans. (New York: Basic Books, 1993), pp. 299-305; Rüdiger Safranski, Martin Heidegger: Between Good and Evil, E. Osers, trans. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1998), pp. 333-4.

[3] Notice that here Heidegger connects the "painful mystery" that yields "wonderful strength" -- that is, the idea of a salvific insight born out of suffering endured -- with a mysterious image of towering, and thus with his understanding of Hölderlin, who lived his last 36 years in a tower overlooking the Neckar river in Tübingen, and whose elegiac "But where the danger lies / There also grows that which saves" helped inspire Heidegger's thinking of "the promise" of a postmodern understanding of being as the other side of "the danger" at the heart of our late-modern epoch of nihilistic, technological optimization. (I explain Heidegger's difficult but crucial view of the "event of enowning" [Ereignis] as the "photographic negative" of the metaphysics of technological enframing in Heidegger, Art, and Postmodernity, Ch. 7.) Davis comes closest to discerning this Hölderlinian connection when he suggests that: "Perhaps philosophers dwell in their 'ivory towers' not only to wonder at the world, but also to serve as watchmen on the look-out for the looming dangers and promising new dawns on the horizon of their epoch of the history of being." (xvii) (While the Goethe connection Davis suggests is intriguing [xv-xvii], I do not think it nearly as important as the more obvious Hölderlin connection he overlooks.) See Martin Heidegger, Letter to his Wife, 1915-1970, G. Heidegger, ed., R. D. V. Glasgow, trans. (Cambridge: Polity, 2008), p. 187; "Mein liebes Seelchen!" Briefe Martin Heideggers an seine Frau Elfride, 1915-1970, G. Heidegger, ed. (Munich: Deutsche Verlags-Anstalt, 2005), pp. 234-5.

[4] Significant chunks of the first dialogue were translated into English by Anderson and Freund as "Conversation on a Country Path about Thinking" and published 45 years ago as the second part of Heidegger's Discourse on Thinking (New York: Harper and Row, 1966), pp. 58-90. The first part of this small book (pp. 43-57) -- the so-called "Memorial Address" (the German title isGelassenheit, that is, "Releasement," the phenomenological comportment in which we let things be what and how they are) -- is probably the most accessible essay the later Heidegger ever wrote, so I frequently assign it in order to introduce undergraduates to his ideas. One problem, however, has been that the best students eagerly go on to read the "Conversation on a Country Path about Thinking" which follows it, despite the fact that it is virtually impossible for them to understand in its abridged and so exceedingly cryptic form. Happily, being able to refer such students to the full dialogue in Country Path Conversations should help clarify matters significantly.

[5] As Heidegger writes in the second "Conversation": "The country path [Feldweg] leads" through the "field [Feld]" or "field of view [Blickfeld] of what we have called 'the strange' [das Seltsame, i.e., "the seldom," the domain of the wonderful]," "where we become aware of just a bit of the abundance -- a bit that is shown by its simple vistas [das seine einfachen Ausblicke zeigen]. / Tower Warden [or Towerer]: Vistas which, against our expectations, bring us to halting stays [Aufenthalten] in the course of our conversation." (120)

[6] In other words, Heidegger seeks to teach us "to listen out into the undetermined" for a "coming [that] essentially occurs all around us and at all times" (147), so that we can learn to disclose such inchoate possibilities responsively and responsibly. I try to explain what this entails -- and why it really matters -- in Heidegger, Art, and Postmodernity.

[7] See Heidegger, Pathmarks, W. McNeill, ed. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998), p. 255 (GA9 335).

[8] I have slightly altered Davis's translation here.

[9] As Davis nicely suggests, Heidegger's notion of "surmising" (Vermuten) means "a mindful and courageous attempt to follow a hunch or pursue an inkling. Surmising is thus . . . a dedication to following presentiments, to presaging pathways of thought that are opened up by intimations of being" (96-7, n. 56).