Courage in the Democratic Polis: Ideology and Critique in Classical Athens

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Ryan K. Balot, Courage in the Democratic Polis: Ideology and Critique in Classical Athens, Oxford University Press, 2014, 408pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199982158.

Reviewed by Chloe Balla, University of Crete


This book is an excellent discussion of early theoretical reflections on andreia (a term derived from the Greek word for man, ἀνήρ, and translated mostly as 'courage' but, depending on the context, also as 'manliness'). Through a thoughtful analysis of the sources, Ryan Balot allows us to understand the role of this cardinal virtue in the construction of competing values that shaped the antithesis between Athenian democracy and its non-democratic rivals. The starting point of his narrative is a statement from Pericles' Funeral Oration, which shows the Athenians' distinctive understanding of courage: "for we differ in this: that we ourselves, the same men, both dare [τολμᾶν] the most and calculate about what we undertake; whereas for others ignorance brings boldness [θράσος], and calculation hesitation" (Thucydides 2.40.3). Starting from Thucydides, Balot's analysis draws on an impressive range of authors and genres: Herodotus, Aeschylus, Euripides, Isocrates, Aristophanes, and Plato, discussed in separate chapters that are organized in a thematic way, that allow the author to explain how courage emerged as a distinctive virtue of the Democratic Polis. As Balot puts it in his concluding chapter:

most Athenians, most of the time, including the poor, were more self-conscious, articulate and independent both in their deliberations about what courage required and in their practices of courage on the battlefield. . . . As the Athenians and the ancient philosophers saw, courage involves having a clear understanding of the reasons for one's behavior. (p. 333)

Thus the purpose of the book is to explore "precisely what such an understanding looked like within Athenian political discourse, with specific reference to the Athenians' reflections on eudaimonia, the democratic politeia, and the common good" (p. 333).

The book is organized in three parts. The first part presents Pericles' account of courage and the reactions to it by various authors, who are not necessarily sympathetic to democratic ideology, and who write in different genres (besides historiography, drama, philosophy, and Isocrates' speeches, which Balot interestingly describes as philosophical). The biggest challenge of this part is to "uncover the dialectic between pro-democratic arguments and critical responses to the demos's ideology and behaviors" (p. 17). The second part of the book bears the cryptic title "Equality, Emotion, and Civic Education". Here Balot discusses democratic courage in connection with the Athenians' ideal of egalitarian military recognition and, drawing on important recent work on the study of emotions, he sheds light on the question of proper motivation for courage. This part ends with a discussion of evidence that shows, within the context of Athenian democracy, awareness of the need to cultivate emotional education within the public sphere. In the third part, Balot discusses his preceding arguments within the context of what he describes as Athenian eudaimonistic ideology.

Balot succeeds in tracing an intriguing continuity between a purely theoretical account of courage, which is well attested in the sources he presents, and the presumably more 'realistic' reflections of Athenian 'practical' ethics, as this is represented in other genres. Implicit throughout the book (as expressed in the formulation "the Athenians and the ancient philosophers") is a distinction between, on the one hand, theoretical discussions of human behavior and, on the other hand, evidence concerning the democratic citizens' actual behavior. This distinction raises some methodological questions. To what extent can we take our literary sources to reflect current attitudes and ideology in an accurate way? Conversely, how confident can we be that the representations we find in non-philosophical genres are not filtered by analytical categories proposed by philosophers? Furthermore, how can we know that the authors whom we might trust as evidence of the ways Athenians defined themselves did not in fact project on the Athenians a normative account that these authors helped to construct, in the course of their own agendas? Is it possible to go beyond representations of the attitudes of Athenian society to the attitudes themselves? In other words, it is important to realize that, at least to some extent, when we discuss the Athenians' reflections on the values that shaped their lives, we are not referring to the ways in which the Athenians themselves behaved or represented themselves, but to certain stereotypes, shaped by authors who reflected either on Greek identity as opposed to its non-Greek counterpart, or on Athenian identity as opposed to its Spartan counterpart. This is certainly not to suggest that Balot is unaware of these issues. He rather chooses to develop his work in the same vein as other important scholars who assume that pro-democratic orations and artwork can be used as more or less reliable sources concerning the actual attitudes of their target-group, the citizens who, as it were, ran the democratic state. However, taking into account the book's broad readership and the fact that most sources postdate the society that Pericles is praising in the Funeral Oration, it would be helpful if the author drew attention to issues of the chronology of the evidence he uses.

With regard to the possible gap that may separate the literary representations of social behavior from the social behavior itself, it is important to stress a methodological premise on the basis of which we might be able to come closer to actual Athenian attitudes and values. This premise turns on the evidence concerning the institutions of the Athenian Democracy, especially with regard to citizen participation. Drawing on important work in the study of Athenian institutions, Balot is stressing the fact that a significant percentage of citizens served at least once on the boule or council. There is no doubt that both the prospect and the actual practice of participation demanded a serious commitment on the citizens' part, and that, despite the unfavorable account of the Platonic dialogues (which involves his contempt toward the kind of knowledge that he sees as merely empirical), the practice that Athenian citizens acquired through their contribution to the running of the city-state presupposed, and at the same time guaranteed, a certain level of sophistication: citizens were expected to evaluate but also to present arguments, a demand that, in turn, allowed, at least some of them, to develop appropriate argumentative skills.[1] What is less clear, however, is whether this commitment entailed an interest in collecting (and possibly also reflecting on) information about practical matters (the kind of knowledge Balot describes as "useful") or whether it also entailed "the Athenians' knowledge of their own ideals, particularly the links between their virtues and their democratic regime" (p. 73).

A further admirable aspect of the book is its attempt to show the relevance of its subject to modern thinking. Balot goes beyond the reconstruction of what the Athenians thought or how they argued about their thoughts, and tries to show how this discussion is indeed relevant to current reflections on courage as a virtue. A well-known expression of such reflections is Susan Sontag's assertion that the 9/11 terrorists were courageous (p. 1).[2] But even before Sontag's statement (and also before the incident that triggered it), classicists had drawn attention to the importance of courage as a cardinal virtue of Greek thought. Unfortunately, the questions of semantics and concept formation that had been raised and developed in that earlier work[3] are almost entirely absent from Balot's book.

This should not be taken as a weakness,[4] but rather as a mark of the book's different, and clearly defined, scope and agenda, which is to argue that the kind of reason-based courage we find formulated in Pericles' Funeral Oration is in fact an intrinsic characteristic of courage as a democratic virtue, quite independently of the historical context under consideration. Thus, in the opening paragraphs, Balot suggests that the study of courage in the ancient polis should become the springboard for our understanding of this very same virtue, which, in a way similar to the one the book unravels, is supposed to characterize still today, "soldiers [that are] commanded to stand and possibly die for democratic ideals" (p. 2). This is an interesting idea, though one may wonder what would be the outcome of a research that would take into account the attitudes of actual citizens who serve as soldiers in modern democracies. Balot opts for a different, and intellectually much more promising, direction. Consistent with the methodology he used in his account of the ancient evidence, Balot seeks for some comparable case of Modern literary representation of democratic courage. The main author who serves as the modern counterpart of Pericles in Balot's argument is Tocqueville. Balot argues that the Periclean account challenges and, at the same time, allows us to qualify Tocqueville's analysis, by showing how (pace Tocqueville) democracy is not antithetical to courage.

Courage in the Democratic Polis addresses readers from a wide range of backgrounds: political scientists, historians and philosophers specializing in antiquity. For the latter, it provides an excellent context for the study not only of texts in which an intellectualist approach concerning courage is explicitly implemented (one of the chapters is naturally devoted to Plato's Laches), but also for a deeper appreciation of the emergence of what is usually described as Socratic intellectualism, as well as of the very dichotomy between reason and emotion (of particular interest in this regard are the emotions of aidos, or shame, and fear).

Balot's arguments are clearly presented and fruitfully engage with current scholarship. He constantly gives credit to scholarship on which he draws. In spite of its value as a mark of academic integrity, this practice may be distracting for some readers (at least some of this material could be moved to the footnotes). At the same time, the wealth of sources and the broad range of historical and theoretical questions that Balot raises show the great benefits of interdisciplinary research and point to challenging new ways of reading classical old texts.

[1] See Aristotle's well-known remark in the opening of his Rhetoric 1.2.

[2] Sontag's text appeared in the New Yorker September 24, 2001.

[3] Andreia: Studies in Manliness and Courage in Classical Antiquity. Edited by R. M. Rosen and I. Sluiter, Brill 2003 (proceedings of a conference held at the University of Leiden in 2000).

[4] Balot himself is well aware of the question. See his discussion of the semantic range of the term andreia in his earlier work: "Subordinating Courage to Justice: Statecraft and Soulcraft in Fourth-Century Athens." Rhetorica 25.1 (2007): 35-52.