Creating Capabilities: The Human Development Approach

Placeholder book cover

Martha C. Nussbaum, Creating Capabilities: The Human Development Approach, Harvard University Press, 2011, 237pp., $22.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674050549.

Reviewed by Ingrid Robeyns, Erasmus University Rotterdam


After Women and Human Development and Frontiers of Justice[1], two books in which she has been developing the capabilities approach as a partial theory of justice, Martha Nussbaum has now written a third book on her capabilities approach. Yet Creating Capabilities is in one sense very different from the earlier two books, since it aims to be an accessible introduction to the capabilities approach that is aiming at undergraduates and general readers. This is not an easy task, given the profoundly interdisciplinary nature of the capabilities approach. Admirably, Creating Capabilities delivers what it sets out to do and serves very well as a first theoretical introduction to the capabilities approach.

Nussbaum describes the capabilities approach as a new theoretical paradigm in the development and policy world, which poses the questions: "What are people actually able to do and to be?" Put differently, the capabilities approach asks which genuine opportunities are open to people. By starting from this question, we will shift the focus of policy and development analysis from resources (incomes at micro-level and GDP per capita at national level) to people's capabilities: the substantive freedoms or opportunities that are created by a combination of the abilities residing inside a person (like capacities and skills) with their social, economic and political environment.

The first chapter offers, through the narrative of the life of Vasanti, a poor Indian woman, an illustration of how the capability approach conducts social evaluations. Chapter two proceeds to offer a more detailed description of the approach, which contains a characterization of the nature of the capability approach which I haven't found in Nussbaum's earlier work and which will interest not only students but also scholars of the approach. According to Nussbaum, there are two different purposes of the capability approach, namely as a theory of social justice and for comparative quality of life assessment, whereby Nussbaum's work exemplifies the first purpose and Amartya Sen's work the second purpose. The two purposes which Nussbaum distinguishes are obviously closely related, and she argues that both share some essential elements: (1) the principle to treat each person as an end, rather than looking at averages; (2) to focus on choice or freedom rather than achievements; (3) to be pluralist about value, which entails that different capabilities are incommensurable; (4) to be deeply concerned with entrenched social injustice and inequality; and (5) to give a clear task to government and public policy (pp. 18-19).

Nussbaum uses the capabilities approach in constructing a theory of basic social justice. As we know from her previous work, Nussbaum has developed a theory of universal fundamental political entitlements. Those entitlements are given, in general terms, by a list of ten central capabilities: life; bodily health; bodily integrity; senses, imagination and thought; emotions; practical reason; affiliation; other species; play; and control over one's environment (pp. 33-34). These entitlements impose duties on governments, who must ensure that all people meet minimal thresholds of those capabilities. In addition to the use of the capabilities approach for thinking about social justice, the approach has also been used by Amartya Sen for purposes of quality of life assessment, which also led to a change of the development debate (most famously illustrated by the analyses presented in the Human Development Reports).

Chapter 3 elaborates in more detail the capabilities approach as a development theory and gives an overview of the work that Amartya Sen and his collaborators have been doing in development economics. Nussbaum rightly notes that in economic policymaking we need a 'counter-theory' for those policies that focus primarily or exclusively on material well-being or, at the aggregate level, on economic growth. It would have been informative for the readers, though, if more had been said on the capability-like initiatives that have already been developed in recent years: more and more economists are trying to measure capabilities (or decent proxies), more and more statistical offices are interested in the approach and trying to see what difference it makes in practice. Moreover, significant progress has been made by the economists of the Oxford Poverty and Human Development Initiative to develop multi-dimensional poverty measures. It would have been good for an introduction to the capability approach to at least have flagged this work on measurement and the increasing acknowledgement of the capability framework by economists, since the results of their studies are one important way to judge to what extent the capability approach makes a difference in practice.

Chapter 4 then moves on to discuss a number of philosophical questions in what Nussbaum regards as the second pillar of the capability approach, namely, a theory of social justice. Nussbaum provides a helicopter view of the many philosophical questions that need to be addressed if one wants to develop a capability theory of justice: the selection of relevant capabilities, the question of justification, its differences with informed-desire accounts of welfarism and with social contract theories, and questions of stability and implementation. Nussbaum also includes a few pages on the question whether the capability approach should be seen as a deontological approach or rather as a consequentialist theory. The exact characterization of the capability approach is an interesting philosophical question, but, in my view, it is also a question that is highly unlikely to interest the broad and non-specialist readership of this book. Moreover, from a scholarly-philosophical point of view much more needs to be said on this issue than is possible in an introductory book. For example, does the capability approach fit the categories of deontological vs. consequentialist theories in the first place? Some guidebooks of ethical theory classify theories as deontological, consequentialist, or as being an alternative to these two dominant families. Perhaps the capability approach, at its most general level, belongs to the latter category?

In the following chapters, Nussbaum discusses a range of questions that have been much discussed in the capability literature or are of special importance for this field. Chapter 5 focuses on the questions of cultural diversity and the approach's claim to universality. Chapter 6 addresses the important question of global poverty and global injustices, drawing on Nussbaum's earlier work in this area. Chapter 7 traces the historical roots of the capabilities approach, including Aristotle and the Stoics, Adam Smith and Thomas Paine, John Stuart Mill and T.H. Green. Chapter 8 surveys a number of topics and issues that have recently been taken up by scholars working on the capabilities approach, such as disadvantage in affluent societies; gender issues; disability, ageing and the importance of care; education; animal entitlements; environmental questions; and constitutional law.

The book has two appendices, which are both, for very different reasons, quite intriguing, although they will be mainly of interest to scholars. Appendix A is entitled 'Heckman on Capabilities' and discusses the work of the economist James Heckman on human capital and the economics of early childhood interventions. Nussbaum argues that Heckman's work should illuminate and enrich the capabilities approach and that bridges should be built between those working on the capability approach and the work done by Heckman and his team. Yet Heckman's use of 'capabilities' really is only the internal side of how capability scholars understand the word; it is about skills, talents, character formation, and personal potential for achievement. So I am puzzled as to why Heckman should be considered a privileged discussion partner for capability scholars. He uses the term 'capabilities', but he is really doing research on something quite different (incidentally, I think that research on early childhood intervention is very important, but that's another matter). In educational studies capability scholars have at length and in great detail explained why we should move from a human capital to a human capability framework if we want to move beyond an economic approach to education. So rather than going into dialogue with a line of research that uses the same term but focuses on something much more narrow than the capability approach does, shouldn't scholars of the capabilities approach engage in dialogues and build bridges with those who are pursuing very similar research under different terminology, such as for example the 'social indicators' movement in Europe that has existed since the 1970s or the work done in development ethics that started primarily in Latin America a few decades ago?

Appendix B analyzes and assesses Amartya Sen's distinction between well-being freedom and agency freedom. Nussbaum doesn't use this distinction and believes that "the distinction is obscure and not useful to one who, like Sen, has rejected (on good grounds) utilitarian notions of well-being" (p. 200). Nussbaum believes that by focusing on capabilities rather than functionings and by giving some capabilities, such as practical reason, a central place on her list of fundamental entitlements, that there is no need for the distinction between agency freedom and well-being freedom. Instead, she argues, "because what is valued is the freedom to do or not to do, agency is woven throughout" (p. 201). Yet many philosophers working on the capability approach, such as David Crocker, have endorsed the distinction between well-being and agency and find it a useful distinction. For example, agency can also refer to certain sacrifices one may want to make of one's own well-being out of commitment to collective values (e.g., the environment or the quality of the public debate) or out of commitment to the value of the quality of life of other people (e.g., the decision of an adult child to care intensively under difficult circumstances for her terminally ill parent). To my mind, there is epistemic value in separating the well-being of those people from their agency. The reason why they made certain choices out of their capabilities is not because they are not interested in these options and hence choose what they prefer for themselves; rather, they choose certain options despite what they would prefer if the only thing they would consider was their own well-being. Hence I do find agency versus well-being a useful distinction, both to understand personal choices but also to analyze population-level phenomena, such as the decrease in well-being of informal intensive care-givers who have made a deliberate choice to provide care by themselves rather than having someone else care for their dependents. It would be a valuable contribution to the scholarly literature if Nussbaum would expand her arguments from the mere four pages in this appendix and would engage with the arguments by the capability scholars who have argued in defense of Sen's agency/well-being distinction.

The publication of this book should be much welcomed, since apart from An Introduction to the Human Development and Capabilities Approach, which has been edited by Séverine Deneulin, no book-length introduction to the capabilities approach was available up until now.[2] Creating Capabilities succeeds well in providing an accessible introduction. Yet introductory books, especially those written by leading scholars in the field, tend to skew the understanding of a theory toward their own favorite interpretation. It is important to highlight that other understandings are also around. In my discussion of the chapters I have already pointed at some aspects where not everyone would agree with the interpretation that is given inCreating Capabilities. Yet in my view the most significant point of disagreement may well be the description of the capabilities approach itself. Nussbaum sees it as a theory with two legs -- theorizing about social justice on the one hand, and comparative quality of life assessment on the other. In the former she is the most prolific author, in the latter Sen is the most canonical figure. Yet I think it is possible to describe the capability approach in more general terms, namely as a theoretical framework that entails two core normative claims: first, the claim that the freedom to achieve well-being is of primary moral importance, and second, that freedom to achieve well-being is to be understood in terms of people's capabilities, that is, their real opportunities to do and be what they have reason to value.[3]

This general description can then be developed into a variety of more specific normative theories, including, most famously, Nussbaum's (partial) theory of social justice and Sen's account of comparative quality of life assessment and development, but also as the basis for (or part of) social criticism, ethnographic studies, policy design in the area of family policies in welfare states, or even -- potentially -- as part of the design of a revolutionary blueprint of a post-capitalist economic system. By describing the capability approach as being either focused on social justice or on comparative quality of life issues, Nussbaum is not sufficiently recognizing the large variety of ways in which the approach is currently already used and is underestimating its potential. To my mind, the capability approach should be defined in more general and abstract terms, as a theory with a scope potentially as wide reaching as utilitiarianism. Philosophers should consider thinking of the capability approach as 'capabilitarianism'.

Lifting the definition of the capabilities approach to this higher level of generality also has consequences for the question of what the 'essential elements' of the approach are. Recall that Nussbaum argues that these are the following elements: (1) to treat each person as an end, rather than looking at averages; (2) to focus on choice or freedom rather than achievements; (3) to be pluralist about value, which entails that different capabilities are incommensurable; (4) to be deeply concerned with entrenched social injustice and inequality; and (5) to give a clear task to government and public policy.

Yet I think this suggests a consensus that does not exist. Not all 'capabilitarian theories' will necessarily endorse the view that we should only focus on choice or freedom. Seeing the capability approach as an umbrella, or a family, of normative theories opens up space for more paternalistic accounts of policy making that defend a mix of capabilities (freedoms) and the functionings (achievements), which Nussbaum's version clearly rejects. Similarly, by dragging the description of the capability approach to a higher, more general, plane, it allows for capability theories of justice that see the role of the state as very limited, instead giving the most significant duties of justice to non-state actors, such as individuals, development NGO's, grassroots organizations, or even more informal collectivities. This enlargement of the scope of the capability approach could drastically increase the contribution it can make to non-ideal theorizing of justice and development, as well as to ethical theory and practice in general.

[1] Martha Nussbaum, Women and Human Development: The Capabilities Approach, New York: Cambridge University Press, 2000; Martha Nussbaum, Frontiers of Justice: Disability, Nationality, Species Membership, Harvard University Press, 2006.

[2] Séverine Deneulin (ed.), The Human Development and Capabilities Approach, London: Earthscan, 2009.

[3] Robeyns, Ingrid, "The Capability Approach", The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2011 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).