Creation and the Sovereignty of God

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Hugh J. McCann, Creation and the Sovereignty of God, Indiana University Press, 2012, 280pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780253357144.

Reviewed by Garrett Pendergraft, Pepperdine University


Hugh McCann's book is a comprehensive and ambitious treatment of some of the most difficult questions surrounding the traditional conception of God and his relationship to the created order. Two features of this treatment make it distinctive: McCann's theodicy of sin and suffering, which takes up the bulk of the book, and his endorsement and articulation of a modified doctrine of divine simplicity (presented in the last chapter). After giving a positive argument for the existence of God, he mostly plays defense: he deftly explains the various difficulties that arise when we try to reconcile intuitive or otherwise well-established physical and metaphysical truths with the traditional doctrines of God, and then offers an extended account that attempts to affirm many of those well-established truths while maintaining a robust commitment to God's perfection and absolute sovereignty.

The project begins with an argument for God's existence. McCann's argument of choice is a type of cosmological argument, construed not deductively but as an inference to the best explanation. Construed in this way, the argument doesn't merely support a first cause, but confirms the hypothesis that the existence of the natural world is the result of a personal creator.

According to the traditional picture, however, God is not just the creator of the world but also the sustainer of the world. Divine sustenance is necessary, argues McCann, because physical events at a given time cannot confer existence on physical events at another time: "God alone confers existence on things, and only he is capable of doing so" (30). Unfortunately, this threatens to make natural causation superfluous, and appears to lead to occasionalism. McCann avoids this result by acknowledging that God creates everything -- including powers, natures, and dispositions -- but also claiming that created entities really do operate on each other. And the key to understanding this position is to eschew an event-causal picture and think instead of the world as being related to God's creative activity in the same way that the content of a decision (i.e., an intention) is related to the decision itself. God is the foundation, the source, of everything -- much like an author is the foundation and source of the story she writes.

If McCann's picture is the right one, then there is another sense in which God's relationship to the world resembles the relationship between an author and her story: just as an author remains outside the timeline of her story, so too does God remain outside the timeline of the created order. This view of God as timeless is difficult to get a handle on, and seems to preclude divine knowledge of tensed truths; for these and other reasons, it has largely been replaced by the view that God is sempiternal (or everlasting). McCann, however, urges its reinstatement, arguing that a sempiternal God would be constrained by time and thus not fully sovereign. He proposes an account of timelessness that would allow for complete interaction with, and knowledge of, the temporal world: God knows which properties he has bestowed on created entities, and he knows every state of affairs that will be produced by the interactions of the entities that bear those properties.

Having thus laid out the structure of the story that God has written, McCann turns to some of the more problematic details. Most pressing, perhaps, is the problem of evil -- i.e., the fact that the story contains such a staggering amount of pain and suffering. Here McCann rejects what is perhaps the most popular response to this problem: the standard free will defense, coupled with a Molinist account of divine providence. McCann rejects this response, citing what he takes to be fundamental problems with the idea of middle knowledge and, even absent those problems, the inability of this response to underwrite a fully robust account of God's providence.

However, despite rejecting the standard free will defense, McCann emphatically does not want to reject the libertarian conception of freedom that's essential to that defense. He thus endorses a non-causal libertarian account according to which libertarian agency, rather than being a causal notion, is instead characterized by intentionality and by what Ginet (1990) dubbed an "actish phenomenal quality." On this view, our exercises of will are part of God's creative activity, but this creative activity is not a process that produces our exercises of will. Instead, our exercises of will are part of the content of God's will, which means that he can be their source without undermining their freedom. (Compare: The actions performed by an author's characters are not causal consequences of anything she does, and nothing about her status as their source undermines their freedom.)

One potential problem with this account is that in making God the author of everything, it appears to have made God the author of sin. But McCann points out that no matter how closely involved God is with our sinful decisions, they fully belong to us. Since God is an entirely different kind of being, it's simply impossible for him to participate in the decisions themselves. Moreover, if we view sin as disobedience to, and thus rebellion against, a divine command, then we see that it is impossible for God to sin: "no one can be in moral rebellion against himself, for no one has moral authority over himself" (120). But even if this maneuver secures divine impeccability, it doesn't get us all the way to perfect goodness. God may not be able to sin, but humans can and do, with shocking frequency. How could a perfectly good being allow so much evil? The answer, inspired in part by Chisholm (1968), is that this evil is an essential component of a greater good, namely the defeat of sin. Friendship with God requires overcoming the enmity and rebellion that characterize sin, and when this is accomplished, sin is defeated.

This arguably takes care of sinful decisions, but what about the pain and suffering that result from those decisions (and from natural evils)? Why is there so much pain and suffering, given that God is perfectly good? McCann's answer, in short, is a soul-making answer: we were created to achieve friendship with God, which requires moral virtue, which in turn requires not only suffering but also fighting against suffering (both our own suffering and the suffering of others). This answer, however, doesn't cover all suffering: in particular, it doesn't cover apparently gratuitous suffering. Although McCann is sympathetic to skeptical theism, his primary response to apparently gratuitous suffering is a novel one: he argues that in some cases, defeating suffering requires accepting it -- accepting that one's allegiance to God shouldn't depend on how well things are going. The appropriate response to apparently gratuitous suffering, then, would be something like Job's response: "Though he slay me, I will hope in him."

The remainder of the book addresses what we might call upstream challenges to the overall picture: questions about divine freedom, about God's relationship to moral truths, and about God's relationship to conceptual truths and entities (entities which include, crucially, the divine attributes). The first such challenge addressed is an apparent lack of divine freedom: it seems that the world God created is the only world he could have created, because he had to create the best possible world. But this is only a problem if we view creation according to a standard deliberative model on which the world is manufactured according to a prior plan. A better model, argues McCann, is a spontaneous one according to which God's creative activity is just that: genuinely creative and thus independent of any blueprint.

So the picture is coming together: God created everything (including our free acts of will) in a single spontaneous act, and what he created is the best it can be because it includes the defeat of evil and the moral development of human agents as they participate in that defeat. However, also included in the "everything" that God created are some things that seem difficult to account for, namely moral principles and conceptual truths. With respect to the principles of morality, McCann argues that they are indeed divine commands, but that these commands are not independent of the natural world (and thus susceptible to arbitrariness objections); rather, they supervene on the natural world and are to a large degree ascertainable by studying the natural world.

Finally, McCann argues that God creates conceptual entities -- universals, logical and mathematical truths, and other abstracta -- simply by creating the concreta in which they're exemplified, and by creating the instances of thinking in which they're conceptualized. There is, however, a very special set of universals that is particularly difficult to account for: the set of universals that pertain to God's own nature. (One difficulty is that God cannot have any accidental properties; thus it his hard to see how he can be free when all of his properties are essential to him. A second difficulty will be addressed below.) Here McCann makes perhaps his boldest and most ambitious move. He endorses a modified version of the doctrine of divine simplicity by arguing that God is identical to an actual state of affairs; God is an intrinsically intentional exercise of freedom (231). Not only does God create and preside over absolutely everything in a single timeless act, God just is that creative act. Thus, the way we understand difficult identity claims (e.g., claims that God is identical with each of his attributes) is by noting that various abstract states of affairs can be manifested in a single concrete state of affairs. (For example, the concrete state of affairs in which Booth assassinated Lincoln is a manifestation of various abstract states of affairs: Lincoln's being killed, treason being committed, and many more besides.) In short, and in conclusion: "God is, essentially, an act of free will -- an act with no prior determination of any kind, in which he freely undertakes to be and to do all that he is and does" (231).

There is much to like about McCann's account, and the overall picture he paints is an attractive one, developed in full view of the most difficult challenges facing the traditional conception of God. However, I think there are several cases in which, despite claims to the contrary, the account does not have the resources required to meet the challenge. In what follows I will focus on three of these cases -- having to do with the doctrines of timelessness, absolute sovereignty, and simplicity.

One challenge for the proponent of divine timelessness is that of explaining how a timeless God can still be a personal God. The problem (which is clearly and forcefully presented in, for example, Pike (1970, Chapter 7)) is that forming intentions seems essential to personhood, and yet it's hard to see how a timeless being could form an intention. Intending something seems to require thinking about that thing before it comes about, and thus seems to require having a temporal position. (Compare McCann's own characterization of intentionality on p. 102 [emphasis in original]: "When we engage in acts of will, we mean to be doing exactly what we are doing, exactly when and as we are doing it.") Perhaps McCann would respond by saying that God's activity is intentional in a different way; but this response would undermine his contention that God acts freely. For on McCann's account, intentionality (characterized temporally) is one of the crucial features of free agency. If God's activity (which, recall, just is God) isn't intentional in the way that's required for human agency, then it's hard to get a handle on the sense in which God's action (and thus God himself) is free -- quite apart from concerns about the necessity of his creating the best possible world.

Another challenge arises from the attempt to reconcile absolute sovereignty with libertarian free will. As mentioned above, McCann insists that our actions can be free despite their being the products of God's will: "God's creative fiat provides entirely for the existence of our decisions and actions," but those decisions and actions are still perfectly free (107). I can do otherwise than I actually do, and "were I to will differently, God would be doing so as well" (109). Moreover, as mentioned above, we are to think of our freedom as analogous to the freedom enjoyed by a character in a novel: "It is true that our destinies are written; but the handwriting is ours" (111). This may in the end be the right picture of the relationship between God's will and ours, but it doesn't strike me as a particularly libertarian picture. The (classical) compatibilist about freedom and determinism is going to say something exactly parallel to the characterization of freedom cited above: that my decisions and actions are entirely provided for (can be fully explained by) prior states and the laws of nature, and that if I were to do otherwise, then the past or the laws would have been different as well. McCann does point out that God's creative activity doesn't operate on us in the same way that a deterministic process would operate on us, but I doubt this distinction is enough to secure his view's libertarian credentials.

My final concern has to do with the doctrine of divine simplicity. McCann recognizes that articulating such a doctrine requires threading the needle between two unacceptable positions: according to a traditional conception, God cannot in any way be dependent on or subject to anything else; any property he has must somehow be a matter of his will (214-215). And yet, we of course can't say that God created or somehow caused himself to exist. McCann, as we saw above, attempts to thread this needle by claiming that God just is an act of free will. But don't actions require actors? If so, then it seems that there can't be any act with which God can be identical unless there's already a person around to do the acting. McCann would likely respond that thinking of God as a concrete state of affairs means that the subject is already built in. For example, "God is not just goodness and justice, but his being good, and his being just" (229). But the point remains: it seems that there can't be an instance of someone's being good, or having any other attribute, unless there's already someone around.

Despite these concerns, Creation and the Sovereignty of God is an impressive and thought-provoking work, well worth a read for those interested in philosophy of religion and philosophical theology.


Chisholm, R. (1968). "The Defeat of Good and Evil." Proceedings of the American Philosophical Association 42: 21-38.

Ginet, C. (1990). On Action. New York: Oxford University Press.

Pike, N. (1970). God and Timelessness. New York: Schocken.