Creation Ethics: Reproduction, Genetics, and Quality of Life

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David DeGrazia, Creation Ethics: Reproduction, Genetics, and Quality of Life, Oxford University Press, 2012, 234pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195389630.

Reviewed by Bonnie Steinbock, State University of New York, Albany


In this excellent book, David DeGrazia addresses ethical and philosophical issues connected with reproduction and genetics. In addition to tackling the philosophical problems, he typically provides fairly detailed policy recommendations for each issue. This is quite a feat in a book not much longer than 200 pages.

One of the main themes is human identity, the subject of DeGrazia's previous book, Human Identity and Bioethics (2005). In Chapter 2, he offers a tripartite view of prenatal moral status, which includes identity, the relevance of sentience to moral status, and the harm of death. Identity is crucial, according to DeGrazia, because the question of the moral status of human embryos and fetuses is answered by determining when these "prenatal human beings" become "one of us." To answer that question, we have to know what we essentially are, that is, we need a theory of numerical identity. DeGrazia thinks that a biological view is more plausible than the alternatives, all of which have counterintuitive results. For example, if one thinks that one is essentially a person, defined as a being with the capacity for relatively complex forms of consciousness, such as thought, language, and self-awareness, then this would imply that none of us was ever a newborn.

DeGrazia rejects even Jeff McMahan's more plausible variant of the personhood view, which says that we are essentially embodied minds, because it implies that we are not animals, which goes against scientifically informed common sense. Instead, we should accept the view that we are essentially biological organisms, which means that we come into existence when the human organism starts to exist. DeGrazia examines the argument for thinking that this occurs at fertilization, but suggests that it is more plausible to place our beginning a bit later. This is because the very early embryo does not function as a single integrated organism, but is "tantamount to a colony of contingently joined zygotes." (22) After two weeks, however, there is considerably more differentiation. Moreover, once the "primitive streak" (the precursor to the spinal cord) forms, spontaneous twinning is no longer possible. At that point, there "undeniably exists a human organism that functions as a single integrated unit." (23)

Regarding sentience, DeGrazia agrees that it is sufficient for having interests and therefore for the possession of moral status, but he rejects the view that sentience is necessary for having interests. He thinks that the potential to become sentient, or to become a person, is as compelling a basis for moral status as sentience, and that part of the reason political liberals overlook potentiality arguments is that they tend to trivialize the notion of potential. With an adequate conception of potential as natural development, the argument from potential gains in plausibility. To see this, imagine that a baby is born who is perfectly healthy, but due to a brainstem anomaly, has never been conscious. She can gain consciousness with a simple medical procedure. Surely the operation is in her interest: "It would be a terrible loss for her not to have the procedure and thereby lose the riches of the life she can have. In the same way, a fetus with the same potential has an interest in remaining alive." (30) Nevertheless, DeGrazia does not accept potentiality as a basis for moral status. Even if one accepts that a pre-sentient fetus has an interest in staying alive, based on its potential, there are powerful grounds for denying that this fetal interest supports a robust right to life.

These grounds stem from the third prong of his view, the Time-Relative Interests Account (TRIA), taken from Jeff McMahan (2002). Most people view the death of a 10-year-old or a 25-year-old as utterly tragic for the victim, in a way that the death of a newborn or a fetus cannot be. If that's correct, then the harm of death cannot be measured solely in terms of how much good life one loses (in terms of both quantity and quality), that is, a whole-life approach. Rather, the TRIA maintains that the harm of death is a function not only of lost opportunities for valuable life, but also the extent to which one is psychologically connected with one's possible future life. (The Psychological Connectedness Account would be, in my opinion, a clearer and more accurate name.)

DeGrazia notes that the TRIA has the advantage of steering a plausible middle course between two polar positions, the desire-satisfaction view and the whole-lifetime approach. The desire-satisfaction view is right that caring about one's future is relevant to the harm of death, but wrong that someone who does not appreciate or desire his or her future life, such as an infant, loses nothing from having that future snatched away. The whole-lifetime approach is right that appreciating one's future is not necessary for having a stake in that future, but incorrect in thinking that such appreciation is irrelevant to the harm of death. Steering between these two views, the TRIA suggests that death significantly harms the infant but not nearly as much as it harms the child, adolescent, or young adult. It gets right what the polar views get right while avoiding their errors.

Because DeGrazia accepts the TRIA, he regards any interest a pre-sentient fetus might have in its continued existence as very weak, too weak to sustain a robust right to life. For this reason, killing a pre-sentient fetus is not comparable to killing a paradigm person, even though it is "one of us." However, this suggests that the moral status of the embryo and fetus is not determined by the tripartite view, as DeGrazia claims, but solely by the TRIA, which is independent of his view on identity. (This is argued by David Shoemaker, 2010.)

In Chapter 3, DeGrazia argues that some of the objections to biomedical enhancement rest on a confusion between two senses of identity: numerical identity (what makes a being one and the same being over time) and narrative identity (an individual's self-conception). For example, some have objected to gene therapy designed to treat a cognitive disorder on the ground that this might alter a person's identity. DeGrazia responds that it is "utterly implausible" that enhancing a person's cognitive abilities would result in a numerically distinct person, so the claim that enhancement could affect identity must refer to narrative identity. This seems right, but it is not clear that the problem stems from a confusion of numerical and narrative identity. The real problem with such objections is that they either assume that change is inherently bad, or they accept that changes might be desirable, but assume that there is something particularly problematic about using genetic means to effect such changes. DeGrazia concludes that some precautions are appropriate to protect unenhanced humans from exploitation, domination or worse. However, he notes that prohibiting genetic enhancement to foreclose the possibility of disaster would be no more sensible than it would have been to prohibit travel by ships and airplanes in view of the possibility of lethal epidemics or annihilation through warfare.

Chapter 4 considers prenatal genetic diagnosis (PGD), prenatal genetic therapy (PGT), and prenatal genetic enhancement (PGE). DeGrazia begins with an excellent overview of the current state of reprogenetics, and what is likely in the near future. Identity once again comes to the forefront in both PGT and PGE, since it is only if an individual exists that he or she can be benefited by therapy or enhancement. For this reason, we need to ask how much change is compatible with a given human being's origination or continued existence. DeGrazia accepts Kripke's view that a given individual could not have come into being from different parents or even different gametes. This is why it is absurd when Lisbeth's mother in The Girl Who Played with Fire says to her daughter, "I should have picked a better [biological] father for you." Picking a different man with whom to reproduce would not have resulted in Lisbeth having a better, non-abusive father, but in her not existing at all.

However, identity is complicated with the possibility of genetic interventions into gametes. DeGrazia poses the following thought-experiment. "Suppose that the very same sperm and egg from which you derived had united in fertilization, but right before that moment a mutation in one of the gametes slightly changed its genome. Intuitively, it seems that, despite the slight change in genome, you would have originated in this counterfactual scenario." (118) Identity is preserved, despite the change in genome, so long as there is little or no change to the later phenotype. However, since the purpose of genetic therapy (or enhancement) is to render a change in genotype that makes a substantial difference to the later phenotype, such as lack of predisposition to a terrible disease, any successful genetic modification will be identity-affecting, "resulting in the origination of a distinct human organism than otherwise would have originated." (119) This is not morally significant, however, since if the intervention is performed on gametes or a zygote (assuming we originate after conception), it does not eliminate a being of our kind. Rather, it prevents such a being from coming to be, just as contraception does, and therefore is not morally objectionable.

What about genetic interventions that take place after one of us has already originated? DeGrazia offers the Robustness Thesis, which says that a post-origination human organism can survive many changes of genotype, including those likely to be pursued in genetic therapy or enhancement. For example, if you get into a car accident and lose many of your cognitive abilities, you're still the same individual. The loss of mental function will affect narrative identity, but not numerical identity. The failure to understand this distinction has led some commentators astray. For example, Noam Zohar has argued that PGT should be excluded from the notion of therapeutic intervention, on the grounds that it does not benefit the individual on whom it is performed because that individual is eliminated and a different one created. DeGrazia suggests that an appreciation of the distinction between numerical and narrative identity would help avoid such mistakes.

Chapter 5 takes up the question of "wrongful life," and whether children can be wronged by being brought into existence under seriously disadvantageous conditions. DeGrazia maintains that a necessary condition of permissible procreation is having "good reason to expect that the individual to be created will come to appreciate and enjoy her life, feeling glad to be alive, without her judgment being deluded." (160) However, he does not think that this is a sufficient condition, because he thinks that parents owe their children much more than simply a life worth living. This topic is taken up in the next chapter, "Bearing and Caring for Children With Disadvantage," which includes a thorough and illuminating discussion of the nonidentity problem. The nonidentity problem arises when the only way to prevent a disadvantageous condition in a child is by preventing the birth of that child, and substituting a different child who will not have the disadvantage.

For example, a physician advises a couple to delay conception because of a medical condition the woman has that would cause any child she has to have a moderate cognitive disability. However, if she takes medication for a month, and then gets pregnant, her child will be mentally normal. Suppose the couple does not take her physician's advice, gets pregnant right away, and has a child who is moderately cognitively disabled, but who has a life well worth living. Most people would regard the couple's behavior as wrong because they knowingly brought a disabled child into the world, when they could easily have avoided this outcome. However, the intuition that they acted wrongly is challenged by the recognition that this child could not have been born mentally normal. For this child, it's life with a moderate cognitive disability or no life at all. If they wait a month to conceive, that will change both the sperm and the egg that conjoin, and therefore the identity of the child. This makes it much harder to claim that the cognitively impaired child, who has a life well worth living, has been harmed or wronged. DeGrazia concludes that we should reject the individual-affecting intuition, which states that every instance of wrongdoing must feature someone who is wronged. Instead, he opts for a hybrid view that includes both individual-affecting and impersonal components. In addition, he concludes that the kind of wrong that characterizes nonidentity cases cannot be explained in terms of what parents owe their children, but must be explained in terms of the impersonal obligation to make things better when one could reasonably have been expected to do so.

The last chapter, "Obligations to Future Generations," continues the discussion of the nonidentity problem as it pertains to global climate change. Decisions about which policy to adopt to combat global climate change are also likely to affect things like travel and job opportunities, which in turn will affect which people meet and marry and have children. "After 200 years of causal ripple effects of the initial policy choice . . . it seems likely to be true of everyone who comes into being that she would not have existed had the alternative policy option been selected." (216) Can we say of the people who come into existence 200 years from now that we have wronged them through our policy choice? It certainly seems that we have done something wrong, given the harmful effects on the people who come to exist, if we could have been reasonably expected to avoid the harms inflicted. However, it is also true that this population could not have had a healthy existence. Had we chose the more responsible, environmentally sound policy, this population would never have existed. As in the case of individual reproductive decisions, the choice is between existing in a harmed condition and not existing at all. Here too DeGrazia embraces a hybrid view with both individual-affecting and impersonal components. The wrong has to be explained in impersonal terms. However, he also adds that those who made the irresponsible decision that led to impersonal harm "showed insufficient regard and respect for future generations." (219) In this respect, those who came into being were wronged, although not harmed, by the irresponsible choice made long before their births.

Creation Ethics provides a wealth of factual information, combined with serious philosophical analysis of extremely difficult questions. It is a major contribution to the burgeoning literature on reproduction and genetics. Anyone interested in these areas will want to give this book a careful read.


DeGrazia, David. 2005. Human Identity and Bioethics. New York: Cambridge University Press.

McMahan, Jeff. 2002. The Ethics of Killing: Problems at the Margins of Life. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Shoemaker, David. 2010. “The Insignificance of Personal Identity for Bioethics,” Bioethics 24, no. 9: 481–489.