Creations of the Mind: Theories of Artifacts and Their Representation

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Eric Margolis and Stephen Laurence (eds.), Creations of the Mind: Theories of Artifacts and Their Representation, Oxford University Press, 2007, 358pp., $49.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199250998.

Reviewed by Beth Preston, University of Georgia


This interdisciplinary volume contains sixteen essays about artifacts. The essays are new, although many of them extend, or provide a new synthesis of, previous work by the contributors. A number of them also provide reviews of the literature in the area of the author's work. The vast majority of the essays are by either philosophers (six) or psychologists (seven). The remaining three are by an anthropologist, an archaeologist and an ethologist. There is a very brief introduction by the editors that outlines some of the questions addressed in the four sections of the volume, but does not provide any significant analysis of the answers. Part I concerns the metaphysics of artifacts. Part II concerns the epistemology of artifacts; more specifically, the way artifacts are conceptualized and categorized. Part III concerns the acquisition of these concepts and categories in development. Part IV concerns the making and use of artifacts by non-human animals and by our now extinct hominid relatives. I will first describe the contributions in each of these sections and then assess the volume as a whole.


Part I (Metaphysics) addresses issues concerning the reality of artifact kinds. All of the essays here are by philosophers. John Searle's contribution summarizes his view in The Construction of Social Reality (1995) that artifacts are a class of entities that are what they are only in virtue of our beliefs about them. Searle says in the first paragraph that he is going to add a plea for a new branch of philosophy called the 'philosophy of society' dealing with questions of social ontology, but he does not actually put up much of an argument for this. Richard Grandy's essay addresses the issue of spatially discontinuous objects. This is an important question for artifact ontology, because artifacts often are taken apart and put back together again in the process of cleaning, repairing or rebuilding them. Grandy attempts to wend his way between the Scylla of theories that allow any arbitrary distribution of parts in space to count as an object and the Charybdis of theories that insist on spatial continuity of parts. He appeals to the notion of dynamic cohesion to fend off the former, and to function and/or designers' intentions that some artifacts be occasionally disassembled and reassembled to fend off the latter. Crawford Elder takes up what may currently be the central issue for artifact ontology, namely, whether artifacts are real objects at all -- there is a tradition going back to Aristotle which holds they are not because of their dependence on human purposes and intentions -- and whether they therefore fall into real kinds analogous to natural kinds. Elder reprises his claim in Real Natures and Familiar Objects (2004) that at least some artifacts are real kinds in virtue of being copied kinds. Importantly, this view enables Elder to deny that artifacts are mind-dependent, since they depend instead on the particulars of the historically construed copying process. This conveniently undercuts the main reasons for thinking that artifacts are not real. Amie Thomasson's contribution takes up this same issue, giving a new series of arguments for conclusions she supported in an earlier article (2003). She agrees with Elder that artifact kinds are real kinds; but argues that they are so in spite of being mind-dependent. Specifically, Thomasson argues that the natures of artifacts are dependent on the intentions and concepts of their human makers, and that because of this we have an epistemically and semantically privileged relationship to artifacts that we do not have to natural objects. But, she holds, the conclusion that artifacts are therefore not real kinds begs the question with regard to the qualifications for being a real kind by assuming that the only legitimate such qualifications are those defining natural kinds. In the final contribution in this section, Jerrold Levinson argues that artworks have a special status because the human intentions that determine their nature are much more open-ended than is the case with other artifacts. For non-art artifacts the maker's intentions must include a substantive conception of features characteristic of that kind of artifact. But the history of art in the last century shows that in the case of artworks, the maker must only intend the work to be regarded or treated as artworks have historically been regarded and treated.

Part II (Concepts and Categories), while heavily weighted towards psychology, is nevertheless the most truly interdisciplinary section of this volume, with three essays by psychologists and one each by a philosopher and an anthropologist. The main issues here concern how we categorize artifacts mentally and linguistically, especially in contradistinction to natural objects, living things, and so on. Barbara Malt and Steven Sloman begin their essay by pointing out that these categories do not necessarily track the metaphysical kinds of Part I, but rather reflect psychological kinds. They start with a review and critique of psychological research on categorization. The alleged purpose of this research is to shed light on how we categorize artifacts in daily life, but the artificial categorization tasks imposed on subjects in the laboratory and the use of naming as criterial for categorization cast doubt on the validity of the results. Malt and Sloman argue that in daily life categorization of artifacts is task specific and context sensitive. As a consequence, they claim, categorization is not a single phenomenon and cannot profitably be studied as such. In the next contribution, Dan Sperber also voices concern about the way philosophical and scientific questions about artifacts are formulated, but from a different direction. He distinguishes biological, cultural and artifactual functions, and then points out that these functions often overlap. In particular, many biological organisms -- chickens, for instance -- are at this point in human history as much part of our culture and as thoroughly artifactual as more paradigmatic artifacts like hammers and neckties. This leads him to question the often unreflectively accepted meta-categories of nature and culture, as well as the idea that a theoretically useful notion of artifact can be constructed on the basis of the usual paradigmatic examples. Hilary Kornblith takes up the quite different question of how artifact kind terms refer. He argues that they refer exactly the way natural kind terms are now thought to refer -- not in virtue of definite descriptions, but in virtue of a baptism and transmission process aided by deference to experts. He argues against Stephen Schwartz that neither an appeal to a distinction between nominal and real kinds, nor to a distinction between hidden and superficial natures cuts any semantic ice. Similarly, he argues against Amie Thomasson that an appeal to the alleged privilege of makers' intentions cuts no semantic ice either. In his short but succinct contribution, Paul Bloom argues that many things -- his main example is water -- are categorized as both artifact kinds and natural kinds. He concludes that our concepts of such things are "hybrid" concepts, and that such hybrid concepts result from children failing to treat natural and artifactual as exclusive categories in the difficult process of learning them. However, Bloom does not draw the further conclusion drawn by Sperber, that these categories just cannot be strictly construed and have therefore little if any purchase for purposes of theory. The final article in this section, by Bradford Mahon and Alfonso Caramazza, reviews a huge amount of literature which investigates the organization and representation of concepts in the brain by examining cases of selective impairment caused by brain damage. They argue that the weight of the evidence runs against the view that organization is perception-based for concepts of living things and function-based for artifacts, and in favor of the view that organization is domain specific, with the main domains being living animate, living inanimate, con-specifics and tools (manipulable artifacts). They also argue against the view that concepts of manipulable artifacts are represented in terms of sensory-motor use patterns, although they seem to regard the evidence here as somewhat less conclusive.

The contributions in Part III (Cognitive Development) are all by psychologists. They revolve around questions of how children come to distinguish artifacts from other kinds of objects and different kinds of artifacts from each other. Jean Mandler begins by reviewing the literature on concept development in infancy, which indicates that infants do distinguish artifacts and animals in a global sort of way, and that these global concepts gradually become more differentiated, e.g., into land, air and sea animals on the one hand, and furniture, vehicles and kitchen utensils on the other. Mandler then argues that this progressive differentiation proceeds through perceptual meaning analysis, in which children redescribe their perceptual experience of objects in a highly simplified way that yields abstract characterizations of different kinds of objects. She goes on to argue that we do not have innate concepts of artifacts and animals, but that the cognitive machinery that underwrites the perceptual meaning analysis by means of which we construct these concepts is wired in. In a similar vein, Deborah Kelemen and Susan Carey claim that we understand and reason about artifacts in terms of a design stance; that is, in terms of the idea that someone intentionally created the artifact to serve a specific function. The essence of an artifact, they say, is this original intended function. They argue that young children construct this design stance on the basis of innate core knowledge that provides representations of objects and their associated causal properties on the one hand, and representations of intentionality on the other. As a consequence, our concept of artifact changes over the course of development. Frank Keil, Marissa Greif and Rebekkah Kerner address the question of how children come to conceptualize the difference between artifacts and living things. They take issue with the idea that designers' intentions are central to this conceptualization, agreeing more with Mandler that perceptual differences are initially key. They point out that artifacts, unlike natural objects, often have right angled edges, for instance. Moreover, they claim that living things fall naturally into hierarchical taxonomies, whereas artifacts form thematic groups, e.g., things for cooking, things for writing, and so on. Finally, they point out that children much more often observe the use of artifacts than the creation of artifacts, and argue that children first develop an intentional understanding of artifacts in terms of the intentions involved in function related goal satisfaction rather than in terms of designers' intentions.

The three essays in Part IV (Evolution) concern the making and use of artifacts by animals and extinct hominids. James Gould's fascinating contribution catalogues animal artifacts under three main headings: artifacts for hunting and foraging; artifacts for protection and shelter; and artifacts for attracting mates. He concludes that although for most animals the construction and use of artifacts is instinct driven, there is now solid evidence that in a surprising number of species it is much more cognitively flexible, driven by goal oriented problem solving rather than automatic responses to environmental stimuli. This prompts him to suggest that animal artifacts and human artifacts are on a continuum, and that the study of the former may generate valuable insights about the latter. Marc Hauser and Laurie Santos follow this suggestion up, in effect, by reviewing what is known at present about how animals conceptualize and represent tools. Unlike Gould, who reports on artifacts animals make and use in their natural habitats, Hauser and Santos draw their evidence largely from laboratory studies. They conclude that the species studied (mostly primates) are able to understand the functions of tools, and even which features of tools are and are not relevant to their functions. Further than that, however, they believe it is unclear what to say regarding such issues as whether animals have a concept of tool as such, or any inkling of the designers' intentions, topics that loom so large in most of the other contributions in this volume. Like Gould, Hauser and Santos emphasize that the comparative study of tool use has great potential. On the other hand, they warn that it is at present methodologically fraught, with a great variety of experimental and observational designs making it difficult to compare results with any confidence. Steven Mithen's contribution reviews and interprets the evidence for artifact making and use among our hominid precursors. He begins with Homo habilis and the Oldowan lithic technology made famous by the Leakeys, and argues that it is closer to the technology of present day chimpanzees than modern humans. In particular, it does not seem to involve the imposition of a preconceived form. This latter characteristic does appear with the enigmatic and often beautifully symmetrical handaxes of Homo heidelbergensis. Mithen believes this aesthetic quality may well indicate a role in attracting mates in addition to a utilitarian function. Finally, Mithen discusses the much more complex technology of Homo neanderthalensis, which he believes still shows no sign of artifacts used for symbolic purposes (beads, for instance); and which remained astonishingly static for millenia, even through environmental shifts which prompted major technological changes on the part of anatomically modern humans. Mithen concludes that our hominid precursors exhibit only domain specific mentality, in contrast to the cognitively fluid mentality of humans. It is this cognitive fluidity, Mithen believes, that accounts for the fact that human artifacts typically have multiple functions that layer utilitarian, communicative, social and symbolic uses over each other.


Eric Margolis and Stephen Laurence, both of whom are philosophers, are to be highly commended for conceiving this volume in the first place, since artifacts have been virtually non-existent as a subject matter in western philosophy. And they have done a good job with quality control. Searle's piece is a bit disappointing, since he does little more than summarize his already well known views. The other contributions are more substantial, though, and even where they recapitulate earlier work, tend to do so in ways that shed additional light on the issues. Margolis and Laurence are also to be highly commended for framing the study of artifacts as an interdisciplinary enterprise. This volume should go a long way towards preventing future philosophical work on artifacts from developing in an insular fashion. On the other hand, given both the current lack of philosophical work on artifacts and the interdisciplinary nature of the contributions, it would have been nice if Margolis and Laurence had provided something more in the way of an introduction. In particular, some analysis of the main connections -- existing or prospective -- among the contributions would have been very desirable. Especially troublesome in this respect is the sense that the metaphysical preoccupations of the philosophers in Part I and the epistemological/cognitive preoccupations of the psychologists and assorted others in the rest of the volume are ships passing in the night with only the briefest of signals (about designers' intentions, would be my guess) flashing between them.

A somewhat more significant cluster of problems starts with the title. That title, Creations of the Mind, suggests two things about artifacts. First, that what is most important about them is that they are made; and second, that what is most important about the process of making them is the mental states involved. One does not want to read too much into a title, of course. But in this case it has substantive connections to what ought to be open and important questions about artifacts that this volume manages to side-step.

Let us start with making. First of all, it is not at all clear from a psychological/cognitive point of view that making is what is most important about artifacts. As Keil, Greif and Kerner, alone of all the contributors, point out, what we mostly do with artifacts is use them. Moreover, in most contemporary cultures individuals make vanishingly few of the artifacts they do use. This may be less true of previous and/or nonindustrialized cultures, which suggests some serious cross-cultural investigation is in order. But more importantly, it suggests that use and the relationship between use and making warrant more specific investigation. Is there any cognitive or psychological difference between using an artifact you did make, as opposed to one you did not make, for instance? Or between using an artifact and using a non-artifact for the same purpose? This point also bears on comparative studies. Although he runs into more than one problem in doing so, for instance, Gould clearly tries to focus only on artifacts animals both make and use. But it is common for animals to use artifacts they did not make. Indeed, Hauser and Santos rely largely on studies of captive animals using human artifacts. (For a wonderful example they do not mention, check out the videos on YouTube of octopuses opening jars to get food.) Moreover, animals, like human beings, often use non-artifacts to accomplish their purposes. Most of the tools used by chimpanzees in the wild are unmodified sticks and stones, for instance. All of this suggests that use is at least as important a phenomenon as making, and quite possibly a more complex one. Most importantly, though, consideration of use leads directly to the crucial foundational issues raised by Sperber about the probity of the nature-culture distinction and the questionable theoretical grounding of common notions of artifact -- issues pretty well ignored by all the other contributors. Sperber's argument rests in large part on his description of a continuum of cases between objects that are used without modification and objects that are uncontroversially made. In light of this continuum and the many nonparadigmatic examples it throws up, what entitles us to assume that there is in the nature of things a strict distinction -- metaphysical, epistemological, psychological, or what have you -- between objects that are made and objects that occur naturally? This is surely a foundational question, and a thoroughly philosophical one at that. But the motivation to even ask it is derailed by the focus on making reinforced by the title of this volume.

A similar problem attends the focus on mind. Taken metaphorically, "creations of the mind" might simply reflect a legitimate choice on the part of the editors to devote this volume to work focusing on the relationship between artifacts and the mind. Other editors with other interests might equally legitimately have chosen to focus on the relationship between artifacts and the social aspects of existence. But taken literally, "creations of the mind" begs the question against something that is supposed to be an open issue here, to wit, whether artifacts are mind dependent entities or not. Moreover, the only contributor among the philosophers in Part I who explicitly argues against the idea that artifacts are mind dependent is Elder. Grandy's opinion is not very explicit, but he seems to have a mixed view in which artifacts are mind dependent in certain respects but perhaps not in others. All the other three contributors in Part I, as well as the lone philosopher relegated to Part II (Kornblith), subscribe to some version of the mind dependence thesis. So what the title literally says is connected to an incipient bias in the philosophical views represented here. One can only hope that someone will regard this unfortunate flaw in an otherwise very valuable volume as an opening and put together a companion volume -- perhaps with the title Creations of the Mind -- Not!


Elder, Crawford. 2004. Real Natures and Familiar Objects. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Margolis, Eric and Stephen Laurence, eds. 1999. Concepts: Core Readings. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Searle, John R. 1995. The Construction of Social Reality. New York: The Free Press.

Thomasson, Amie. 2003. "Realism and Human Kinds," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 67 (3): 580-609.