Creatively Undecided: Toward a History and Philosophy of Scientific Agency

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Menachem Fisch, Creatively Undecided: Toward a History and Philosophy of Scientific Agency, University of Chicago Press, 2017, 295 pp., $37.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780226514512.

Reviewed by K. Brad Wray, Aarhus University


Fisch aims to offer a philosophy of scientific agency. Specifically, the book is framed around developing an account of how a scientist can be persuaded to accept a new theory, one that is fundamentally different from the theory she currently accepts. Fisch argues that this is a problem that Thomas Kuhn left us with. Given Kuhn's theory of scientific change, according to which science progresses through radical revolutionary changes of theory, one needs to explain how such changes are rationally mediated. One needs to explain how reasons that are external to one's conceptual framework can move one to abandon that framework.

Fisch maintains that neither Kuhn nor his successors, critics nor sympathetic commentators, provided an adequate answer to the challenge Kuhn raised. That is, no one has satisfactorily explained how one could change one's view when such a change requires a significant rethinking and reassessment of one's values. That, after all, is what theory change involves, assuming Kuhn is correct.

This book has three very distinct parts. Part One provides Fisch's motivation for the project, including an account of his own personal journey that led him to embark upon it. In Part Two, Fisch engages with a body of literature and set of scholars who have had insightful, but ultimately unsatisfactory, solutions to the problem of agency. Fisch is especially concerned with agency as it encounters challenges, such as changes of world views. Here he discusses the work of Michael Friedman, Christine Korsgaard, Robert Brandom, Harry Frankfurt, John McDowell, and Charles Taylor. He also draws on Peter Galison's insightful notion of trading zones to make sense of the space in which someone might encounter a serious challenge to a view that one holds with very strong convictions. In Part Three, Fisch purports to illustrate his view of scientific agency with an episode from the history of mathematics, focusing on the 19th century British mathematician George Peacock and his developing views on algebra.

The book is most personal in its exposition and structure. Every book is a journey through the author's thoughts, but this one is decidedly different. It is most personal, and idiosyncratic.

Part One takes the reader through Fisch's journey to the task of writing this book. He describes, for example, the early and lasting influence of Popper on his thinking (page 16). He also describes his work in the history of 19th century mathematics (pages 13-15). At first, as I read it, I thought he intended to exemplify a larger point related to the theme of the book, radical change of view. But, in the end, this is not the case. Popper did not loom large in the analyses, and Fisch's own journey in the history of mathematics did not provide insight about the problem the book aimed to address, developing a philosophy of scientific agency. Consequently, I was left wondering why I needed to go through this rather personal process with Fisch. It did not provide any insight either in terms of process, perspective, or structure for the rest of the book.

Part Two is the most philosophical part of the book. But it seems to never get where it is supposed to go. It did not end with a clear account of how rational theory change is possible. Hence, there was no sense in which one got a clear account of scientific agency, as Fisch understands the term. Even Fisch's choice of authors, though individually interesting, seemed very idiosyncratic. Korsgaard, for example, is clearly an important thinker to be reckoned with in moral philosophy. But I am not convinced that her views illuminate something about the nature of scientific agency. Frankfurt seems equally out of place given the topic of the book. Only Friedman's work seems to be relevant to the issue at hand. Further, one wonders why Fisch did not engage with Bas van Fraassen's The Empirical Stance, where van Fraassen explicitly takes on the problem of explaining radical theory change. Van Fraassen's reflections on Sartre seem far more relevant to Fisch's concerns than most of the other sources he engages with.

Part Three was also very personal, and idiosyncratic. Though the book purports to be about scientific agency, it addresses an example from the history of mathematics. In itself, this is not a bad thing. But the problem that Fisch purports to be addressing is alleged to originate in Kuhn's Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Kuhn, though, was concerned only with the natural sciences, physics, astronomy, chemistry, and biology. So, insofar as the issue that concerns Fisch originates with Kuhn, a study of mathematics, a non-empirical science, seems inappropriate. Further, if Fisch's aim was to address or engage scholars in the philosophy of science, he missed his mark. The example, though interesting in detail, will have little traction with philosophers of science who will know little about this episode in the history of mathematics, nor be able to see its relevance to the sorts of historical examples that they are preoccupied with. And Fisch provides no special rationale for why this particular case, though far from the mainstream, is relevant to the concerns of philosophers of science.

The book ends rather abruptly. What is missing is a final chapter that brings the three pieces together. Most importantly, the two substantive parts of the book, Part Two and Part Three, are never explicitly connected. The last 400 words of the book provide some indication of the intended connections. But this is far too brief to do the job required. As a reader, I was left wondering where the last chapter was. I did not see the theory of scientific agency, insofar as it was developed in Part Two, applied to the historical case study presented in Part Three. The pieces were too disconnected to be left to the reader to connect them himself.

The problems in the book run deeper. The motivation that allegedly originated with Kuhn seems odd. It is not clear that it represents a problem that Kuhn had with science. Rather, it seems that Fisch is taking on the Kuhn that Israel Scheffler constructed in Science and Subjectivity. Even Fisch's case study could have benefited from engaging with Kuhn's work in a broader way. I am no expert in the history of mathematics, but I was struck by the similarities between the story Fisch told about these 19th century British mathematicians and Kuhn's account of Planck's contribution to quantum mechanics in Black-Body Theory and the Quantum Discontinuity, 1894-1912. Like Planck, it seemed that Fisch's mathematicians were led to a view that they had not intended, which was developed, in large part, because it took on a life of its own, developed by others in directions and ways that were unanticipated. It is not at all clear to me what the example says about scientific agency.

Had Fisch moved past Scheffler's Kuhn, he would see that Kuhn never believed that conceptual frameworks were impervious to external criticism. And instead of needing to invoke Galison's trading zones, Fisch could see that, even in Structure, Kuhn makes it clear that as a paradigm or theory is developed through the course of normal scientific research, it inevitably breaks down and proves to be ineffective, unable to satisfy the needs of researchers, even those who have long worked with the conceptual resources supplied by the paradigm.

In summary, unfortunately this book does not fulfill its aim of developing a philosophy of scientific agency.