Crime and Punishment: A Concise Moral Critique

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Hyman Gross, Crime and Punishment: A Concise Moral Critique, Oxford University Press, 2012, 219pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199644711.

Reviewed by Eric A. Johnson, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


In this book, Hyman Gross argues that criminal-law theorists spend too much time talking about the morality of the accused's conduct and too little talking about the morality of the government's decision to punish. Though the book touches on a wide array of topics -- ranging from legal impossibility to pretrial discovery to police interrogation practices -- it addresses each of these topics in the service of two main arguments. First, Gross argues that by putting undue emphasis on moral evaluation of the accused's conduct -- "by confounding criminal law with moral intuitions" (83) -- current criminal-law theory has brought about a kind of "moral intoxication," which in turn has led both to the overuse of criminal sanctions and to the adoption of law-enforcement practices that are heavily skewed toward conviction. Second, Gross argues that the cure for the criminal justice system's current shortcomings lies in putting the moral focus where it belongs, namely, on the political morality of the government's decision to punish.

In arguing, first, that current criminal-law theory puts too much emphasis on the morality of the accused's conduct, Gross does not deny -- as some determinists would -- that the accused's conduct even is subject to moral scrutiny. Nor does he deny that conduct that is punished as criminal often happens to be morally culpable. What Gross denies is just that the moral culpability of the accused's conduct has any direct bearing on the justifiability of punishment. What he denies, in other words, is that the conduct's moral culpability has any direct bearing on the separate moral dilemma that faces the government when it decides whether to impose punishment for the conduct.

This means, of course, that Gross rejects retributivism, which treats the accused's moral culpability as a necessary and sufficient condition for the imposition of punishment. (Though Gross occasionally speaks, as retributivists do, of what the accused "deserves," he appears to mean by this what the accused deserves legally, not what the accused deserves morally.) Gross also rejects those varieties of consequentialism -- like Henry Hart's -- in which the utility of punishment is thought to hinge partly on a community judgment of moral condemnation. He rejects, for example, the view that punishment is designed in part to cultivate in citizens "an appreciation of what is right and wrong." (38)

Part of the trouble with views like these, according to Gross, is that the government should not be in the moral education business. The government ought, rather, to permit citizens to discover for themselves their "natural moral inclinations." (39) Moreover, the use of punishment for the sake of cultivating morality really has the opposite effect, in Gross's view. Far from cultivating morality, the expression of community condemnation through criminal punishment encourages a kind of self-righteous moralizing that is destructive of genuine morality. Among the effects of this "moral intoxication" or "moral infatuation" is overuse of the criminal sanction by officials acting "under the banner of facile moral rectitude." (84) Also among the effects of this moral intoxication, Gross argues, is the production in law-abiding citizens of a pernicious "sense of superiority" over those who have been convicted of crimes. (71)

Further, even if society had something to gain by the identification and formal condemnation of morally culpable conduct, says Gross, the criminal-justice process would not be the right vehicle for the required moral evaluation. Real moral evaluation would require us to consider not just the narrow time-frame of the crime itself but "the larger context" in which the crime occurred. (39) It would require us to consider, for example, whether the accused is among "that portion of the population that [is] born into conditions of hopeless deprivation and violence." (83) The criminal law does not require courts to consider this larger context, nor could it really. If the criminal law were to make the imposition of punishment depend on the larger context, Gross argues, it would be unable to discharge its primary (and perhaps only legitimate) function, namely, "social self-defense." (15) "If we are to live together we cannot afford the luxury of judging each person's acts with an understanding that best suits his personality and his personal history. Harm, and threats of it, have a life of their own that must be paid attention to." (143-44)

Alongside this critique of contemporary criminal-law theory, Gross develops his own theory of punishment, whose focus is the political morality of the government's decision to punish. Gross's own theory of punishment is basically consequentialist, though he is less concerned with the distinction between consequentialism and retributivism than with the distinction between "meliorism" and "preservationism." Most criminal-law theorists, he argues, are meliorists in that they suppose that punishment "makes things better" and, accordingly, in their theorizing "stress the beneficial consequences of punishment." (19, 28) Gross argues that punishment cannot improve anything -- cannot, for example, make an already peaceable society more peaceable -- but only can prevent society disintegrating entirely. (Differences in crime rates among peaceable societies are, he implies, attributable to social conditions unrelated to punishment.) For Gross, then, punishment is justified not by "the beneficial consequences of punishment" but rather by "the evils of impunity." (5) Impunity would, he explains, mean the end of "life as we know it in civilized society," in part because impunity would leave unassuaged the "strong feelings" produced by serious crimes and so would "leave us no choice but to take the law into our own hands." (3) It is only to "prevent the collapse into social chaos" that punishment is justified, he says. (173)

By framing his punishment theory in terms of "the evils of impunity," rather than in terms of punishment's benefits, Gross means partly to emphasize that punishment affects society only very indirectly and only over the long term. Punishment does not, for example, make itself felt directly through general deterrence, since neither "those who are normally law-abiding" nor "those who are not now law-abiding" are likely to be influenced by news of an offender's punishment. (3-4) A consistent failure to punish would, however, eventually make itself felt indirectly in individuals' perceptions of the criminal law. By undermining the credibility of the criminal law's threats, Gross argues, universal impunity eventually would cause society's collapse.

What is controversial about Gross's "anti-impunity" theory of punishment, though, is not his emphasis on the indirectness of punishment's effects but, rather, his claim that punishment is justified only to the degree necessary to prevent the disintegration of society. This claim is not about values. Gross would acknowledge, I think, that the prevention of additional rapes, murders, and robberies always would count as a social good, even if the prevention of those rapes, murders, and robberies merely were to represent a slight decrease in the crime rate. Gross's claim about the limits of punishment is, rather, a claim about facts. Gross appears to assert, as a factual matter, that punishment can do nothing, even indirectly, to affect crime rates within a minimally functional society.

Gross does not offer empirical evidence to support this assertion. Instead, he relies mostly on a burden-shifting argument. He argues that punishment is "repugnant" and a violation of "natural human rights" and that, accordingly, the "standard for justification of criminal punishment must be very demanding and must be rigorously applied." (9) Specifically, Gross asserts that we ought to demand -- by way of justification for criminal punishment -- the kind of evidence that would survive the "beyond a reasonable doubt" standard in a criminal prosecution or the "strict scrutiny" standard in constitutional litigation. Gross argues that the existing evidence of punishment's benefits does not satisfy these standards, except in relation to punishment's role in preventing the utter disintegration of society. Thus, punishment is impermissible except to the degree necessary to prevent society's disintegration.

In the introduction, Gross describes his book as a "voyage of . . . rediscovery," (xiii) and this nicely captures what is most appealing about the book. To a criminal lawyer practicing in the 1950s or 1960s, it probably would have seemed obvious in what direction moral progress lay. The seeming trajectory of moral progress was defined in part by a gradual decrease over time in the severity of criminal sentences. But it also -- and perhaps more fundamentally -- was defined in part by what people said about the purposes of punishment. State constitutions adopted during the nineteenth and early twentieth centuries often specifically identified the purposes for which criminal sanctions were justified. None mentioned retribution or community condemnation of the offender; none said anything at all about morality or accountability. Instead, they spoke mostly of the prevention of crime and the protection of the public. Some, like Montana's and Indiana's, said specifically that the criminal law was not about "vindictive justice." Gross wants to recapture, I think, the non-moralizing spirit that lay behind this way of talking about the criminal law's objectives. And he wants to articulate what is intuitively troubling (for many of us) about the criminal law's subsequent turn toward retribution and moral condemnation. He is mostly successful on both scores.

At some points, though, Gross's argument is underdeveloped. Take, for example, Gross's argument that the "standard for justification of criminal punishment must be very demanding and must be rigorously applied." (9) This burden-shifting argument, which is central both to Gross's own theory of punishment and to his critique of other theories, is grounded partly on an analogy to the law of self-defense. Specifically, Gross argues that the government's use of punishment in "social self-defense" ought to be subject to roughly the same restrictions that the criminal law imposes on an individual's use of force in self-defense. (14-15) "There is always great stringency in the requirements for the defense of self-defense," Gross argues. (15) The defense requires, for example, that the threat posed by the attacker be "imminent." (14) Gross argues that by the same token we ought, as a society, to refrain from punishment "if we are less than certain about the consequences of impunity." (15)

But this argument misreads the law of self-defense in two obvious respects. First, the law of self-defense does not require that an individual be "certain" of the necessity of defensive force before he acts; instead, it requires only that the individual "believe" or "reasonably believe" that defensive force is necessary. Since a "belief" that force is necessary might co-exist with awareness of a strong possibility that the belief is mistaken, this standard does not require anything like certainty. Second, though the law of self-defense does require that the actor refrain from using force unless the threat is "imminent," the existence of this imminence requirement is no reason to suppose that a comparable requirement applies to the government's use of criminal punishment. The purpose of the imminence requirement, after all, is to force the individual citizen whenever possible to resort to government help, rather than to self-help. Thus, far from suggesting that the government has a duty to refrain from acting on threats of violence that are less than imminent, the imminence requirement actually suggests that the government has an affirmative duty to stem less-than-imminent threats of violence. And, indeed, Gross himself acknowledges that "it is the aim of any proper government to minimize the need for self-protection." (22-23) Gross's analogy to self-defense does not really support his burden-shifting argument, then.

As an alternative basis for his burden-shifting argument, Gross invokes the "beyond a reasonable doubt" standard, arguing in effect that the usual practice of applying this standard to adjudicative facts in criminal trials can only be grounded in a broader principle requiring the government always to resolve doubts against the imposition of punishment. "Since liability to punishment must be proved beyond a reasonable doubt in individual cases," he argues, "the need to have on the books laws creating such liability must be proved beyond a reasonable doubt" (68). But this analogy works neither as a legal nor as a philosophical argument. As a legal argument, it founders on the distinction between case-specific adjudicative facts and so-called "legislative facts," which inform the resolution of broader policy questions by legislatures and courts. No court or scholar ever has supposed that the reasonable-doubt standard applies to legislative facts underlying criminal statutes and doctrines. Nor is it clear even how legislatures and courts would go about applying this standard to legislative facts.

As a philosophical argument, Gross's reasonable-doubt analogy is undercut by his failure to defend the broader principle that, on his view, underlies the reasonable-doubt standard, namely, the principle that the government always must resolve any doubts against the imposition of punishment. Gross acknowledges that the government not only has a duty to refrain from punishing its citizens needlessly but also has "a duty to protect those within its jurisdiction from serious harm at the hands of others" -- has a duty to prevent crime, in other words. (11) Gross acknowledges, too, that the right not to be raped, murdered, or robbed is a "natural human right," just like the right not to be punished. (56) From these two acknowledgments, however, it would seem to follow that the government, in developing criminal-law policy, ought to assign roughly equal weight to the risk of under-punishment and the risk of over-punishment. It would seem to follow, in other words, that the government should be indifferent as between (a) a risk that by punishing too little or too infrequently, it will fail to prevent serious crimes that otherwise would have been prevented; and (b) a risk that by punishing too much or too often, it will impose punishment that is needless.

This is not Gross's view, of course. But he does not say why. Perhaps he assumes, as other criminal-law theorists appear to have done, that the distinction between acts and omissions informs not only the moral evaluation of individuals' conduct but the moral evaluation of government conduct, too. If so, this assumption requires defense, as Sunstein and Vermeule recently have argued.

Gross's burden-shifting argument is not unrepresentative; in this and other instances, Gross's arguments seem not to justify the degree of conviction conveyed by his language. Still, his arguments are thought-provoking and worthwhile; they are good enough to start a conversation, if not to end it. Gross, again, is successful in articulating, or re-articulating, a set of moral intuitions that once were widely shared among attorneys and scholars and that probably are ripe for reconsideration. And he is successful, too, in raising hard questions about whether criminal-law theory's turn away from these intuitions -- and toward ideas of retribution and moral condemnation -- is connected somehow to shortcomings, both substantive and procedural, in the present criminal justice system.


Henry M. Hart Jr., "The Aims of the Criminal Law," Law & Contemporary Problems 23: 401-441 (1958).

Cass R. Sunstein & Adrian Vermeule, "Is Capital Punishment Morally Required? Acts, Omissions, and Life-Life Tradeoffs," Stanford Law Review 58:703-750 (2005).