Crimes Against Humanity: A Normative Account

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Larry May, Crimes Against Humanity: A Normative Account, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 326 pp., $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521600510.

Reviewed by Christopher B. Gray, Concordia University


Dusko Tadic lacks Augusto Pinochet's or Adolf Eichmann's notoriety for criminal wrongs, but Larry May is even more concerned with his liability before international criminal courts.

May's book is an attempt to provide a philosophically sound justification for determining individual criminal liability at international law for crimes against humanity. This is an exercise in legal philosophy, not law or the moral philosophy of these wrongs. The book stresses that this effort is normative, which means that its conclusions do not rest upon consent or contract, acceptance or practice, for their force, but upon moral principles which May works out.

These moral principles May identifies as Hobbesian, and his technique as positivist; he is aware that some of each persuasion may not recognize themselves in this version, or in his many essays on Hobbes. The stance May commits to is a defendant-oriented approach, both to balance law's strongly prosecutorial approach, and because this will allow countries concerned over potential unfairness toward their nationals to sign on. May recalls his country's refusal of the International Criminal Court in its 1998 version.

The attention upon collective harms in this book relates to his earlier Morality of Groups in 1987 on corporate harm and liability in commercial settings, as in his 1992 Sharing Responsibility and 1991edited Collective Responsibility. His sensitivity to differing national practices resonates with his 1996 Socially Responsible Self and co-edited volumes, on gender in the 1996 Rethinking Masculinity, on religious practices and medical associations' liabilities in the 1999 Praying for a Cure, and the multicultural Legal Philosophy in 2000 and Applied Ethics in 2002. Turning toward the future, May projects this as his first of several volumes on the normative foundations of international criminal law, the next to be on war crimes.

May leaves no doubt how he is doing that job. A striking stylistic feature in resolving the "conceptual difficulties" that provoke him throughout is his continual rehearsal of where in the design his momentary pause sits among what has been done already and what remains to be done. This is done at the beginning and end of the four parts and their thirteen chapters, and even at the half dozen sections in each. Together with a fluent style that eschews repeating premises of any Argument at Hand as AH1, AH2, etc., this makes the text accessible for practitioners to whom as well as philosophers he intends to address those arguments. The 35 pages of endnotes, ten of bibliography, and four-page index work to the same end. Among reference there to "the greats" and current articles in philosophy and law, alongside referrals to international cases, reports and quasi-statutes, the most numerous citations are to M. Cherif Bassiouni and William A. Schabas, whose stature as International Court judge and as UniversitŽ de MontrŽal scholar in droit international respectively inform May's own conclusions.

The first part, on universal norms and moral minimalism, claims that individuals' pursuit of survival both justifies the sovereignty of a state as protector, and permits resistance to sovereignty when it fails or attacks the pursuit; failure of sovereignty permits even outside intrusion and so justifies jus cogens norms binding across borders even without consent. The second part develops two principles for international criminal liability. The security principle restates moral minimalism to permit intervention. The international-harm principle limits liability for crimes against humanity to harms perpetrated on or by groups. The case study of rape as instrument of war or genocide illustrates the importance and difficulty of using these two principles to prosecute individuals in international courts when national courts decline.

The third part turns much more concrete, eponymously by taking the wrongdoers named above to task, and philosophically by focusing on the jural favorites of act and intent elements, but now during international prosecutions, as well as probing further the ontology of groupings. May approves the greater difficulty in condemning minor players, grunts on the ground, and in prosecuting only some wrongdoers for what was widely done, than in achieving the conviction of officers and executives. Study of these results continues in the final part on defenses and alternatives, where recent restrictions on legitimate defenses, and the employment of prosecutions which ill fit the rule of law, all in order not to scandalize victims should their perpetrators prove unconvictible, point towards achieving acceptable outcomes through means other than prosecution, namely by reconciliation and amnesty programs. As the first part centered around obligation, and the second around liability, the final one rehearses the changes that international law makes in issues concerning punishment.

May forecloses some half dozen objections expertly at the end of each chapter. The remainder of this review takes up some he does not mention.

In part one, May's insistence upon Hobbes' rationale for his moral minimalism, in league with Hart's minimum content, is centered around the inability of consensual norms to become ius cogens, universally binding norms, as are needed to justify any cross-border intervention. But does Hobbes do this, and does consent not do it?

Little is said about whether Hobbes' argument yields prudential rather than moral results, and whether prudence yields normativity. Instead, the argument is stated in terms of the war of all on all that few now accept. For today's classical theorist with assertion of humans' always-already-social nature or species being; or for the pragmatic anthropologist affirming that evolutionary mechanism is symbiotic parasitism, not decimating species, the circumstances for Hobbes' natural right to survive, and in turn his first and second natural laws to seek peace, or to do whatever to seek survival, have less footing. Nor in turn does a sovereignty generated from that, or the limits upon it. May acknowledges that not all agree, and pushes onward.

The reason May uses this foundation is because it is more possible to get sovereignties to agree to act according to that norm, than according to other more extensive norms of natural law. Some moral norm is needed to lift the protection of peoples out of mere consent; but the purpose of selecting this moral norm is because it induces consent. May is interested in finding a normative basis for jus cogens because that will be more useful in inducing agreement to permit intervention, not in inducing conduct responsive to the obligation.

May's resistance to consent, whether contract or treaty -- "After all, treaties are just elaborate contracts" -- as a source for normativity of obligation, and in turn for liability to intervention upon violating it, is because consent binds only those consenting and not the future, so that a state may subsequently decide to end its consent. He is persuasive that endurance of consent will not fill the gap, since the endurance of dissent makes that also ever more legitimate. But endurance is not needed, since consent within an agreement changes the moral goodness of conduct in the future, unlike, without contract, announcement of intent that one's behavior will occur in the future. The latter allows rescinding the consent to be morally upright, often, while the former does not. True, this does not extend the obligation to any autonomous persons or states even without their consent, as obligation a priori would; but it does allow its extension throughout regional agreements, without invalidation by withdrawals.

While the second part recapitulates that argument as the first condition for international criminal prosecution, it mainly attends to the second condition which it introduces, that such prosecution be for harms which have a group character, either in that groups are its victims, or that states and state-like groups are its perpetrators. This is not because wrongdoers will fail to be prosecuted if their wrong is not group-based, but because their prosecution rightly belongs to domestic courts, not international, even if the wrongdoers are effectively immune there. A reason which is subsidiary to this is used throughout the book, that accountability to criminal courts at any level involves liability to be deprived of liberty if convicted; and that this potential damage is the most serious sort which, when weighed against the harms, needs to be accomplished fairly if respect for international criminal law is to be achieved. Discussion is brief to dismiss the severity of other penal consequences, and the weighting of harms to victims against harm to perpetrators.

More problematic is the other reason for insisting upon the "widespreadness" of the crime. Crimes against humanity properly exceed local jurisdictions; and violations of the human rights to security belonging to groups are the only ones whose international prosecution states can be expected to accept now. The claim that this group feature makes criminal wrongs into crimes against humanity needs explanation.

It looks just the opposite. Groups are attacked not because they are human, but because they are Armenian or Muslim, Tutsi or Ibo. May handles this truism by the unacknowledged Hegelian move, that to characterize victims in this way is to ignore their human characteristic, namely their uniqueness, and so to attack directly their humanity, not as civil wrongs attack their being a shareholder or an auto driver. While the second wrong admits their rights but violates them, the first does not admit they are rights bearers at all. The difficulty is that Hegel made this the distinctive move for any crime, not for international crime. Using it to differentiate the class of crime that is to be prosecuted by an international tribunal needs more.

That is what the prosecutions are for. Whom the prosecutions are against awaits in part three, where the problem is that the elements of crimes against humanity are seldom found together. The intent is the generals', not the soldiers'; the conduct is the combatants', not the leaders'. Tadic never intended to destroy all Muslims (nor could one man), but only at random or those neighbors he had targeted; Pinochet surely never applied the live electrical wires.

May resists getting around the first branch by reducing the mental requirement from intent to knowledge, because that opens too far the possibility of convicting innocents. He explains this by invoking the distinction discarded by many jurisdictions between specific or additional intent and general intent: to avoid strict liability, Tadic had to intend to kill Muslims as such; it is not enough to kill them for fun and profit, while knowing there was an ongoing project to eliminate them. In a long discussion May does not explain why this is or is not one of the cases in which they coalesce as, for example, they do widely in the offences of penetrating this woman-known-unwilling and penetrating this woman-as-unwilling. Eventually May allows knowledge to substitute for intent, but only as an intent, transferred, oblique or constructive.

The second branch is dealt with more successfully in principle, since planners of crimes against humanity can be taken to be a part of the crime and have liability to punishment for it, analogously to conspiracies at domestic law. He makes that analogy frequently, but knows it will not be successful since he acknowledges the lack of conspiracy as a crime in international law.

The rule-of-law criteria in part four require that selective prosecution not be undertaken; this demand adjoins the principles "no crime without a law" in parts one and two, and "no punishment without a crime" just above. Since often the only available accused are the soldiers left behind and not the leaders, and never the victors, this disinclines from prosecuting even when it is possible. This refuses to complete the circle of principles with "no law without a punishment," or remedy. This recommendation seems highly unintuitive, when the reason for the selectivity is that the law can only work on those it can hold, and when a truly international court can summon victors to the bar as well. "One has to start somewhere," he agrees.

But the point of resisting some trials lies elsewhere. Dissuaded first by this rule-of-law concern, and then by laconic rejection of retribution as having anything to do with the rightful attention to victims, and not only to perpetrators, the argument moves not toward the conclusion expected, that we need find some way around these problems; but to the opposite, that we sometimes abandon prosecution, and substitute alternatives like amnesty and reconciliation. The moral minimalism used here again for social security has more in common with its polar non-penal response, of pure compensation, which May rejects.

May's excellent book is assured of what he says would be its success, that it make even a few philosophers and lawyers think harder on these topics.