Critical Pragmatics: An Inquiry into Reference and Communication

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Kepa Korta and John Perry, Critical Pragmatics: An Inquiry into Reference and Communication, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 178pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521748674.

Reviewed by Lenny Clapp, Instituto de Investigaciones Filosoficas, Universidad Nacional Autónoma de México


The "basic thesis" of this book is that "reference involves role-management" and the meanings of referential terms (demonstratives and demonstrative phrases, indexicals, personal pronouns, names, and definite descriptions) "are what enable utterances of them to have the role-management uses that they do" (p. 36). The thesis and the crucial notion of role-management are illustrated by Korta and Perry's observations concerning examples such as the following: Suppose you are eating dinner with some people and you want the salt, which you cannot reach. In order to bring about relief from saltlessness, you want one of your fellow diners to pass you the salt. Assuming that nothing extraordinary is going on, which of the following sentences would be most appropriate for you to use in this situation?

(A) I'd like some salt.

(B) N would like some salt. (where N is your name)

Korta and Perry explain why a use of (A) would be more appropriate:

Here you are conveying to your hearer that a certain person would like the salt. The predicate 'like some salt' conveys what the person, to whom you refer, would like. The word 'I' conveys which person that is, but it does more than that. By producing your utterances so that it is heard, you provide the hearer a succession of cognitive fixes on the referent, that is the person of whom wanting the salt is being predicated. It is (i) the person who the speaker is referring to. Your choice of 'I' indicates that that person is (ii) the speaker of the utterance. In this particular situation, the hearer can see who the speaker is: (iii) the person next to him. This puts him in a position to carry out the implicit request, and pass you the salt. (p. 33)

This passage describes, in a cursory way, the referential plan that would underlie a use of (A). In virtue of the hearer's assumed mastery of the meaning of 'I', your use of (A) provides her with a perceptual cognitive fix on the referent, which facilitates the action you want her to perform. The hearer's knowledge of the meaning of 'I' informs her that whatever thing it is that plays the conversational role of speaker, that thing wants the salt. This semantic knowledge together with her perceptual abilities inform her that the person who plays the epistemic role of being seen across the table is the same person who plays the speaker role. By coming to realize that the same thing, you, plays both roles, the hearer can come to recognize your intention to communicate to her that you, the person she sees across the table, want the salt. Thus the referential plan underlying a use of (A) requires relatively little of the hearer: she need only be a competent English speaker with common perceptual and cognitive abilities. In contrast, the referential plan underlying a use of (B) "puts an unnecessary cognitive burden on the hearer" (p. 35). That is, the referential plan underlying a use of (B) "assumes that people will have a rich enough notion of [N] to recognize [you], and that is an assumption most ordinary folk won't make, when there is a simpler way of getting the hearer to have the appropriate cognitive fix, by using the first person" (p. 35).

The project of Critical Pragmatics is to develop the sort of explanation sketched above into a theory of the act of referring and the meanings of referential terms, and to explore some of the consequences that such a theory has for more general issues, such as how the interface between semantics and pragmatics is to be understood. The book's thirteen chapters are organized as follows: Chapters 1-4 are devoted to introducing the thesis that "reference is role-management," clarifying important terminology (e.g., 'role', 'referential plan', 'cognitive fix'), and situating the project of the book within the traditional debate between referentialism and descriptivism. Each of chapters 5-9 is dedicated to a particular kind of referential device: chapter 5 examines the "role-management" facilitated by demonstratives; chapter 6 concerns indexicals; chapter 7 concerns names; chapter 8 concerns definite descriptions; and chapter 9 reviews Perry's position with regard to "implicit reference" to "unarticulated constituents" (102). Finally, chapters 10-13 explore some of the consequences the emerging theory has for other issues in pragmatics, including speech-act theory (chapter 10), implicatures (chapter 11), the semantics-pragmatics interface (chapter 12), and the relations between content, information, and action (chapter 13).

There is then a lot going on in this relatively short book, and I cannot here describe, much less comment on, all of the arguments and issues addressed by Korta and Perry. So my remarks here will be limited. I will first describe the motivations and general structure of the theory of reference advocated in Critical Pragmatics, and attempt to clarify, at least a bit, some of the important theoretical ideas. Second, I will offer a critical remark concerning Korta and Perry's position with regard to definite descriptions (chapter 8), and I will abstract from this specific criticism a more general complaint concerning what Korta and Perry call "the no-reference problem" (p. 88). Finally, I will conclude with some brief remarks concerning the much debated semantics-pragmatics interface.

Korta and Perry's thesis that reference is role-management, as well as the more encompassing perspective of pragmatics they advocate, rest upon three central and interrelated ideas:

Language as action. The first idea, that we see ourselves getting from Austin, is that . . . acts of using language, or utterances, have a basic structure that is an instance of the general structure of actions: an agent, by moving her body and its parts in various ways, in various circumstances, accomplishes things. (p. 3)[1]

Communicative intentions. This second idea, that we see coming from Grice, connects language as action to language as a possessor of content. . . . Grice's idea was that the meaning of phrases and contents of utterances derive ultimately from human intentions, and in particular a special sort of intentions, communicative intentions. . . . A communicative intention has its own recognition as one its goals. (p. 4)[2]

Reflexive versus referential truth-conditions. The third idea comes from Perry . . . by way of Perry's work with Jon Barwise on situation semantics (p. 5).

The idea is that we can consider under what conditions an utterance might be true -- or more precisely, what the rest of the world has to be like for the utterance to occur and be true -- simply given the constraints on truth-conditions provided by the meanings of words as fixed by the conventions of language, or, taking in addition, further facts about the utterance, such as the speaker, time, place, and the objects referred to with the use of names and demonstratives. (p. 7)

Korta and Perry claim that the combination of these central ideas yields two results: first, the speaker's plan in performing an utterance "should be a basic unit of study in pragmatics" because "it is this that the hearer has to grasp to understand the utterance" (p. 5); and second, "what language provides . . . and what semantics systematically treats, are ways of acting and in particular ways of disclosing one's intentions to others" (p. 5). These results are illustrated in the explanation sketched above concerning the differences in cognitive significance between uses of (A) and (B): Understanding utterances of (A) and (B) is a matter of discerning the communicative intentions the speaker has in performing the acts of uttering the sentences, including his referential plans. Because the constraints provided by the conventional meaning of the name Nand the pronoun 'I' are different, different referential plans are appropriate for uses of (A) and (B). In particular, the referential plan for (A), described in the above citation, appeals to reflexive content involving a cognitive fix that is characterized by the reflexive description (ii), 'the speaker of this utterance', whereas the referential plan for (B) involves a distinct cognitive fix that is characterized by a reflexive description involving the conventions of using N, something like 'the origin of the network the speaker of this utterance exploits by using N'.[3] Thus, discerning the referential plan appropriate for a use of (A) requires the hearer to have a different cognitive fix on you than does discerning the referential plan appropriate for a use of (B). And it is for this reason that utterances of (A) and (B) have different cognitive significance, even though the referential content is the same -- given that you are playing both the role of the speaker of the utterance and the role of the origin of the network the speaker of the utterance exploits by using N.

The foregoing provides, at best, a blurry snapshot of the pragmatic approach to reference advocated by Korta and Perry. In the first four chapters, particularly chapters 3 and 4, they present the idea of a referential plan and its role in communication in much more detail, introducing along the way a battery of new concepts that are required for describing the complex structure of intentions that constitute a referential plan. I cannot here examine these more detailed aspects of Korta and Perry's sophisticated view, and thus I now turn to making a brief critical remark concerning chapter 8, which addresses definite descriptions, and then I will generalize my criticism and complain that there is an important lacuna in Critical Pragmatics concerning the issue of reference failure.

Korta and Perry adapt Russell's theory of descriptions to their "utterance-based approach" (p. 92) by amending Russell's theory so that it accounts for both the phenomenon of so-called incomplete descriptions as well as Donnellan's (1966) distinction between referential and attributive uses. Russell's theory is characterized as follows:

(1) Definite descriptions are not real syntactic units in a logical language, and are misleadingly so in natural language.

(2) A statement of the form "The F is G" is true if there is a unique F and it is G.

(3) Such statements are false if there is no F, or if there is more than one F, or if there is exactly one F and it is not G.

(4) The proposition expressed by such a statement does not contain the designation of the definite description, if any, as a constituent (p. 90).

At least for the most part,[4] consideration of incomplete definite descriptions leads Korta and Perry to amend theses (1), (2) and (3), whereas consideration of referential uses leads them to amend thesis (4). Here I will be concerned only with the amended versions of (1), (2) and (3).

The phenomenon of incomplete definite descriptions poses a problem for Russell's theory because principle (3) counter-intuitively implies that most statements of the form "the F is G" are false. This is because for most F's there is more than one thing that is F. Korta and Perry propose to resolve the problem by, first, analyzing 'the' as a generalized quantifier, and second, appealing to Perry's concept of unarticulated constituents to further restrict the domains for uses of this generalized quantifier. Combining these ideas yields the following amended principles:

(1) Definite descriptions are real syntactic units of natural language.

(2a) A speaker S uses a definite description 'The F' to narrow down a set of objects B that S takes to be contextually available to the hearer H. The use of the description denotes the subset of the Bs that are also Fs if that set is a singleton, otherwise it denotes the null set. If the use of a description denotes a singleton whose only member is x, the use of the description designates x.

(2b) A statement "The F is G" is true if "the F" designates an object x, and x is G.

(3) Such statements are false if "The F" does not designate an object, or it does but the object is not G. (pp. 93-94)

My criticism is that the amended thesis (3) -- which would seem to reflect Russell's desire to preserve bivalence for natural language -- does not fit well with the central ideas of language as action and communicative intentions. Korta and Perry maintain that in general "language provides the speaker with tools to help the hearer discover his intentions" (p. 99) and more specifically "definite descriptions, like referring expressions and phrases, provide the speaker with tools for getting the hearer to identify the object about which the speaker intends to assert something" (p. 99). But if a speaker's goal in using a definite description is to bring it about that the hearer has a particular sort of cognitive fix on an object -- an object to which the speaker endeavors to refer -- then what should we say about cases where this goal cannot be achieved because there is no one relevant object on which the speaker and hearer can cognitively fix? Principle (3), following Russell, maintains that in such cases what the speaker says isfalse. But this does not seem like the right thing for Korta and Perry to say. It is telling, I think, that two of the historical figures Korta and Perry cite as important influences on their pragmatic approach -- Strawson (1950) and Austin (1961) -- would reject (3).

Consider a slightly amended version of an example used by Korta and Perry. Suppose I attempt to say something obviously true by uttering, 'The senator from California is a senator', but, being a philosopher ignorant of all things political, I do not sufficiently "narrow down" the domain B, and thus my use of 'The senator from California' is incomplete -- I denote the null set, and designate nothing. According to amended principle (3), my statement is thus false. But then by asserting the negation of the sentence, I must say something true. But this result is extremely counter-intuitive; only a philosopher with ulterior motives would judge a dialogue such as the following to be acceptable:

Peter: (Ci) The senator from California is a senator.

Bertrand: (Cii) No, that's false because there are two senators from California.

Peter: (Ciii) Oh, OK. So, the senator from California is not a senator.

And note that a Russell-inspired appeal to a wide-scope reading of the negation in (Ciii) seems to be blocked by amended principle (1). The thesis that 'the senator from California' is a "real syntactic unit" of (Ciii) would seem to imply that (Ciii) is analyzable -- as Strawson (1950) maintained -- as having subject-predicate form, and the negation of such sentences utilizes narrow-scope, adverbial, negation. Of course this issue has a long and complicated history, and I doubt that the brief argument I have presented here will persuade those already committed to something like principle (3). But Korta and Perry are not so committed -- or at least they ought not be. I suggest then that Korta and Perry should reject principle (3) in favor of something along the lines of Strawson's (1950) view that (at least many) uses of definite descriptions that do not designate any object x are spurious and thus statements involving such uses are neither true not false.

What do Korta and Perry say about the "no-reference problem" for other expressions, viz. demonstratives, indexicals, and names? Are they committed to Russell-inspired analogues of principle (3), such that utterances utilizing "empty" expressions of these other categories are also claimed to be false, as opposed to spurious? It is not clear. With regard to both demonstratives (pp. 57-58) and names (pp. 88-89), Korta and Perry explain how the multi-propositionalism that is underwritten by the third central idea (viz. "Reflexive versus referential truth-conditions," p. 5) allows them to assign various sorts of reflexive truth-conditions to utterances involving empty demonstratives and empty names. But it is simply not clear whether they think the locutionary content of such utterances is false, or simply not true. My more general complaint is then thatCritical Pragmatics does not adequately address the problematic phenomenon of reference failure. The problem is addressed in the most detail in Chapter 8, with regard to uses of definite descriptions that lack designations, but here, where details are provided, the theory advocated by Korta and Perry seems to be in tension with their more fundamental theoretical commitments.

I will conclude with a brief remark concerning the semantics-pragmatics distinction. In Chapter 12 Korta and Perry propose drawing the distinction as follows:

the clauses of semantic theory assign reflexive conditions of reference and truth on the basis of syntactic form. Facts about the intentions of the speaker in uttering the expression, and contextual facts, yield the referential level of content, which in the case of declarative sentences will be the locutionary content of the utterance. So pragmatics, semantics, and other relevant facts about an utterance come together at locutionary content. . . . Locutionary content is not the output of the semantic part of the theory, but a joint determination of the semantic part, the pragmatic part, and other facts about the utterance. (p. 140)

As Korta and Perry note, this way of drawing the distinction has much in common with recent proposals that advocate truth-conditional pragmatics; such proposals include Sperber and Wilson's relevance theory (1986) as well as the contextualism advocated in Recanati (2004). Moreover, as Korta and Perry also note, all these approaches require rejecting the classic "code model of communication" (p. 161), according to which understanding an utterance is essentially a matter of decoding a signal. Defenders of the code model, i.e., advocates of traditional truth-conditional semantics in the tradition of Frege, often charge that truth-conditional pragmatics is motivated by purely negative considerations -- truth-conditional pragmatics is often, and with some justification, accused of being long on counterexamples and short on explanations. The "intention-recognition model" (p. 161) of reference and communication proposed in Critical Pragmatics, though clearly in need of further development, constitutes a significant step toward a response to this accusation.

Works Cited

Austin, J.L. (1961). How to Do Things with Words. Oxford University Press.

Donnellan, K, (1966). "Reference and Definite Descriptions," The Philosophical Review 75: 281-304.

Grice, H.P. (1969). "Utterer's Meaning and Intentions," The Philosophical Review 78: 147-177.

Perry, J. (2001). Reference and Reflexivity, Stanford, CSLI Publications.

Recanati, F. (2004). Literal Meaning, Cambridge University Press.

Sperber, D and Wilson, M. (1986). Relevance: Communication and Cognition, Oxford, Blackwell.

Strawson, P. (1950). "On Referring," Mind, 59: 320-344.

[1] Understanding utterances as actions implies both that utterances are intentional, and that one utterance-event can instantiate multiple actions -- as is illustrated by Austin's (1961) distinction between locutionary, illocutionary, and perlocutionary acts. The remaining two central ideas are concerned with these implications.

[2] The communicative intention is what Grice (1969) called "the M-intention." The idea is that the speaker's utterance u has the content p because the speaker intends for the hearer to come to believe p by recognizing that the speaker's intention in performing u is to bring about the hearer's adopting this belief.

[3] The concept of a speaker exploiting a network of a name N is developed in chapter 7.

[4] In the final statement of their theory, principle (3) is inexplicably amended to allow that uses of "The F" that fail to designate an object "are not true, and at least in some cases false" (p. 100). Though this significant change is nowhere explained, it seems to be motivated not by Strawson-inspired views on referential-presupposition failure, but rather by consideration of special cases in which the speaker realizes that no object is designated by "The F", but she nonetheless succeeds in communicating a singular proposition about a particular object she has in mind (p. 99).