Critical Theory in Critical Times: Transforming the Global Political and Economic Order

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Penelope Deutscher and Cristina Lafont (eds.), Critical Theory in Critical Times: Transforming the Global Political and Economic Order, Columbia University Press, 2017, 290pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231181518.

Reviewed by Peter Niesen, Universität Hamburg


Can Critical Theory[1] today have a "critical" function in the several meanings of the term -- crisis-induced, non-affirmative, indispensable, and cutting edge? Whether there is a well-formed answer to that question depends on whether there is a sufficiently unified understanding of what Critical Theory is. Understood historically, Critical Theory is scholarly work in the early Frankfurt School tradition of combining philosophical analysis and speculation with state-of-the-art social, political and legal research. In their critique of capitalist economy and society, Theodor W. Adorno and Max Horkheimer, the key members of the founding generation, relied on Hegelian-Marxist background assumptions that no longer claim universal philosophical comprehensibility, as most authors in this volume seem to concur. Adorno and Horkheimer also put little faith in democracy. The work of Jürgen Habermas and authors in his wake, in contrast, is characterized by a parallel commitment to democracy as a basic and non-instrumental normative presupposition of law and progressive politics, and at the same time to a less metaphysically demanding style in philosophical argument, including a stronger appreciation of the need for critique itself to spell out what kind of presuppositions it invokes. This democratic turn in Critical Theory has understandably come under pressure as the regulatory power of the democratic state is waning, as global capitalism is overriding its redistributive potential, as nationalist entrepreneurs celebrate massive electoral gains, while the internal and external historical injustices of democratic states are being addressed and the historical pre-eminence of the West is being challenged.

The volume addresses three main topics in five sections: the current state of democracy and human rights, the current state of global capitalism, and the conceptual and theoretical resources of Critical Theory itself. The first section "The Future of Democracy" contains one article by Jürgen Habermas on the supranationalization of democracy in the European Union. The second contains three articles, one each by Seyla Benhabib, Cristina Lafont, and Rainer Forst, on current linkages and tensions between democratic sovereignty and human rights. The third section "Political Rights in Neoliberal Times," has articles by Wendy Brown and Christoph Menke. It paves the way for a fourth section, "Criticizing Capitalism," with contributions by Nancy Fraser and Rahel Jaeggi. The last section, "The End of Progress in Postcolonial Times," turns Critical Theory against itself and asks about the limitations of current theorizing, with contributions by Amy Allen, Penelope Deutscher, and Charles Mills. I want to first address the issue of democracy and human rights, next, the critique of capitalism and, finally, the (self-)critique of Critical Theory. Much of my criticism will address the individual approaches in what is an altogether strikingly vibrant collective effort, attesting to the fact that Critical Theory today thrives in both of its major thematic preoccupations -- the critique of capitalism and the future of democratic autonomy -- as well as exhibiting a healthy pugnacious spirit amongst its proponents.

Democracy and Human Rights

Some classical approaches in political philosophy -- whether late Rawlsian, Carl Schmittian, or natural rights foundationalist -- have tried to drive a conceptual wedge between concern for individual rights and concern for democracy. The first four essays, including Habermas's, all attack such abstract juxtaposition, arguing not only that the validity of human rights has a proto-democratic genesis, such that democratic self-determination needs to be accepted as a core human right (Forst), but also that democratic self-government contributes to raising the standards of rights and justice (Benhabib) and that it can bolster the global realization of human rights (Lafont).

Habermas's article on supranational democracy in the European Union is occasioned by the Eurozone financial crisis and resulting austerity policies. It is all the more timely after the Brexit referendum, since he advocates the regaining of democratic control over a supranational bureaucracy not by nationalist regression, but by recognizing that sovereignty has been split in the EU, between citizens conceived of as members of their nation state demoi and as members of the European polity. Habermas identifies the authoritarian management of monetary and borrowing policies as the main challenge to the legitimacy of that polity, and advocates an intra-European politicization that may bring about a pan-European social policy. This will not make nation states obsolete, since they are to guarantee historically achieved levels of basic rights -- an empirical conviction Habermas shares with the German Constitutional Court, which is, however, currently being tested by 'democratic backsliding' in, amongst other member states, Hungary and Poland. Although Habermas introduces his account of the European Union as a model conception for transnational democracy, the following articles do not take up his invitation to think of the global reconciliation of rights and democracy as a matter of split sovereignty. In this, they illustrate that beyond the nation state's historical fusion of democracy and human rights, there may lie many ways, not just one, of productively recombining their elements.

Seyla Benhabib starts out with the crisis induced by U.S. American 'exemptionalism' in international law, more precisely by the Supreme Court's recent methodological eclipse of foreign torts. The remedial cosmopolitanism she advocates is one of legal cultures taking in and reflecting foreign and global experiences and standards. Her view is that democratic sovereignty has the task of interpreting and making concrete an exceedingly abstract common concept of human rights. Outside of this autonomous exercise of self-government "we cannot justify the range of variation in the content of human rights as being basically legitimate." This account bites the human rights quietism of Rawls and some of his followers, but it is unclear what resistance it can offer to the eccentric U.S. Supreme Court interpretations of, for example, the human rights to religious freedom and freedom of speech, or, to mention another example, to the "bringing rights back home" discourse advocated by UK nationalists. Benhabib admits that courts are not the paradigm sites to perform "democratic iteration," i.e. the participatory transformation of local practices in light of new challenges to equality and universality. But if the productive stimuli for human rights interpretations result from the influence of border-crossing cosmopolitan movements, it would seem necessary to complement such democratic iteration, operating from within the normative and institutional resources adopted in a given country, with a cosmopolitan iteration of international law.

While Benhabib focuses on how democratic sovereignty can back up human rights, Cristina Lafont argues that, in many ways, institutionalized and enforceable international human rights strengthen the sovereignty and equality of states in the international arena against the pressures exerted by hegemonic states and powerful business interests. For example, in WTO conflicts over intellectual property in major health crises, states hit hard by epidemics were happy to insist that in infringing medical companies' copyrights, they were securing their citizens' human right to health. This is all the more plausible where states are held responsible, under the international legal norm of a 'responsibility to protect', not only for respecting and protecting, but also for fulfilling their citizens' human rights. Lafont's account has the virtues of 'bringing states back in', as well as enlarging the list of addressees of human rights obligations to international organizations, but its rehabilitation of the progressive aspects of statehood fails to be sensitive to the non-democratic character of some of the beneficiaries' states. Her approach strengthens sovereign self-determination in rights-sensitive areas, but the self-determination in question is something that populist autocracies can likewise appeal to.

It falls to Rainer Forst to outline a renewed shared basis between individual human rights and democratic self-determination. In his conceptual paper, he berates minimalist conceptions of human rights for failing to see the common root of human rights and democratic self-government. This common root lies in a right to justification, the basic idea being that such a right is to protect us not only against the social infliction of unjustifiable harms, but to "protect against the harm of not being part of the political determination of what counts as such harms." Of course, the conceptual priority of those latter harms does not entail that the establishment of a "basic order of justification" should have temporal priority over the establishment of a tolerably justified basic order. Forst's conception is therefore silent as to whether our 'critical times' demand the securing of minimally understood human rights with special urgency, or as to which political tendencies in our crisis-ridden time deserve our support. In contrast to Habermas, Benhabib, and Lafont, Forst starts out with a well-founded normative conception and discusses divergences from it, thereby making it hard for his account to be specifically, and not only generically, responsive to genuinely current transformations.

Summing up our discussion so far, Critical Theory is productively re-establishing conceptual connections between human rights and democracy. The articles in the first part show that neither is there such a thing as a dominant route for a democratic transformation of global affairs, nor will reverting to such connections in itself trigger specific demands for messy situations.

Critique of Capitalism

The first generation of Critical Theorists thought of capitalist societies only implicitly in terms of injustice or workers' exploitation, but, along with the early Marx, invested more systematic energy into theorizing alienation, reification and the domination of nature. The four articles on global capitalism share this circuitous approach, if only to formulate secure theoretical bases from which more hands-on criticism can then take off. They all formulate fresh advances over standard ways of discussing the stranglehold of capitalism on our societies. The piece by Christoph Menke serves to induce a dose of skepticism as to whether, as legalistic Critical Theorists like Habermas, Ingeborg Maus, and Bill Scheuerman have assumed, reverting to a democratic allocation of individual rights is part of critique, and not, at the same time, part of a critical pathology. Menke's article is perhaps closest in spirit to the first generation of Critical Theorists, in deducing what is wrong with capitalism from purely conceptual features of its central vehicle, subjective rights. Their internally contradictory nature, in uniting the defensive and arbitrary function of "private law" with the participatory yet equally arbitrary features of what he terms "social law," guarantees capitalism's inescapable regime. As with earlier authors in Western Marxism, alas, one would have to accept that 'contradictions' are in the world, not in the mind or in language, to appreciate Menke's view, and the endemic use of the term in the second part of the volume attests to the hope that 'contradiction' can make a comeback as part of a lingua franca of Critical Theory.

Wendy Brown tackles the dominant conception of law under today's specifically neoliberal variant of capitalism, analyzing the U.S. Supreme Court's Citizens United decision as proof that the terms of political conflict have now been irretrievably subjected to the vocabulary of the marketplace. Her Foucaultian reading forcefully brings out that the Supreme Court's idiosyncratic identification of money and speech amounts to a capitulation to a higher, plutocratic rationality. It fails to mention the nationalist restrictions, highlighted in Benhabib's paper, shaping the Supreme Court's First Amendment decisions. While domestic spending for candidates knows no limits, foreigners cannot claim the same rights to accessing the political marketplace. If U.S. money is protected speech, and foreign money unprotected propaganda, the U.S. Court does not erase so much the difference between natural persons and corporations, as that between American citizens and American corporations. In a time where populism regularly beats neoliberalism, as the Brexit referendum and the outcome of Trump vs. Clinton attest, it seems necessary to heed the protectionist and sovereigntist elements in capitalism's current setup.

Nancy Fraser discusses this setup neither as a conceptual framework nor as an economic system, but as a global system of order. Capitalism, though still appreciated as a "common root" of "the heterogeneous evils that surround us", should no longer be seen as definitive of social totality. Fraser attacks the view that "capitalism propels the ever-increasing commodification of life as such." Yet she rediscovers, with a nod to David Harvey, capitalism's exploitation (not so much of workers but) of the non-economic sources of original accumulation: nature, familial care, democratic coordination. Her anti-determinist account allows her to attack the increasing depth of capitalist expropriation and interference into nature as self-destructive (again, a 'contradiction' -- why should a practice be 'contradictory' if it is not sustainable?)

Treating capitalism as a defective normative order prepares a turn that would have seemed problematic to the earlier Critical Theorists up to and including Habermas, a turn to subjecting capitalism to an overall normative or 'ethical' evaluation. Rahel Jaeggi completes this turn and treats capitalism as one economic ethic among possible others. Her article is more circumspect than other recent attempts to imbue markets, labour and production under capitalism directly with normativity -- think of the simplistic advice that 'effective altruism,' for example, offers. But her view is that we need an unflinchingly teleological conception of the economy that would allow us to pronounce on what is sane and what is pathological in economic behavior and economic practices. It is difficult to see her Aristotelianism as capable of preserving the normative advantages of a functionalist view of the economy: the modernist understanding that partly self-regulating coordination frees up social complexity, and the freedom-enhancing aspects of anonymous, no-strings-attached interactions. There is a conflict on the horizon between Brown's skillful dismantling of neoliberalism's moralizing imputations, of the foul generalizations our pseudo-meritocratic economies produce, and Jaeggi's supercharging of economic transactions with ethical meaning. The four critics of capitalism disagree not just as to which standards a global domestication of capitalism should follow, but also as to whether an ethicization or a fundamental de-ethicization of the economic sphere is desirable in the first place.

(Self-)critique of Critical Theory

The third part is dedicated to probing the deficits of current Critical Theory itself, which has been good practice since Immanuel Kant's first Critique. It contains a lead essay by Amy Allen with sympathetic responses from Penelope Deutscher and Charles Mills, who share Allen's view of the Eurocentric character of late Critical Theory. Deutscher contributes a subtle reading of Foucault's understanding of the present, thereby accentuating beyond Allen a "sense of uncertainty" from which to formulate critique and alternatives. Mills rightly berates mainstream Critical Theory for largely evading the topics of racism and colonialism (keeping in mind that this is not true for the work of Thomas A. McCarthy). The charge of Eurocentric parochialism is certainly crucial for current Critical Theorists to respond to, but they don't get to do that in this volume. Given that most of the eight contributors in parts one and two would reject Allen's virtuoso attack, this gives the volume a willfully aporetic ending.

Allen rejects current Critical Theory's orientation toward progress. She elegantly weaves together central tenets of Adorno's philosophy with elements of Foucault's methodology. She distinguishes, with Adorno, between progress as an imperative and progress as a fact, rejecting the Hegelian interpretation of history as the march of progress. Her own suggestion is to reconstruct "history as a story of both progress and regress." Of course, understanding our historical situation as one grand progressive state of affairs seems obscene, but it is hard to see who currently holds such a view, or which generation of Critical Theorists is unaware or in denial of historical regresses. At the same time, doing away with spurious macro-facts does not entail that we cannot identify small-scale instances of progress-as-fact. On the contrary, Allen's own suggestion to reconstruct history "as a story of both progress and regress" seems to rely on invoking an understanding of instances of progress beyond aspiration or imperative, instances that can be critically evaluated as present or absent in our social world. Allen believes, with Adorno, that we cannot imagine what could replace the current social world that holds us captive (as some formulations in the Theory of Communicative Action unguardedly suggested), but, more importantly, that we can't appreciate which aspects of current practices ought to be relied on in transcending it. In place of the more mundane conceptions of equality and autonomy, she seeks recourse to Adorno's idea of incommensurable freedom. Much as this idea deserves reconsideration, it seems too ephemeral to redeem all that is worth redeeming in the ideals of the Enlightenment.

To sum up, this volume displays an attractive, combative physiognomy of current Critical Theory. The editors succeed in highlighting its virtues in three crucial areas: its awareness that discourses about international law and human rights ought not be severed from a preoccupation with democratic legitimacy; its diagnosis that all critique of capitalism needs to rely on an account of what kind of beast capitalism is today, and its consciousness that a tradition of critical thought needs exposure to sharp internal and external criticism. The volume demonstrates that there is still a unity of concern in current Critical Theory, in its debate over standards, ideals and legacy institutions of the Enlightenment, and over the fittingness of legal and political practices in domesticating capitalism. There is no methodological unity to the papers, and the articles that start afresh with the challenges posed by our 'critical times' seem to me to represent a more thoroughly critical attitude than the conceptual pieces that neither run the risk of being superseded by current developments, nor try to speak explicitly to a specific challenge.

Yet facing 'our' critical times has its methodological problems, too, and this may open another fault line in Critical Theory. Does Critical Theory sharpen its wits at its philosophical end, while its empirical basis gets fuzzier? In many of the papers, constitutional and international law have replaced studies in social science or economics as the crucial entry point to social reality, and the confidence displayed in interpreting the long arcs of legal evolution is impressive throughout. But while the diagnoses of the current state of law differ between those adhering, in Habermas' style, to a reform-minded appropriation of innovative legal developments, and those resigned, with Foucault, to the fact that our legalistic mindsets deeply compromise what we can hope to achieve, the issue of what constitutes our legal reality, and how we can tell, is up for grabs. A condition for a continued debate would therefore seem to be a joint foothold in 'legal objectivity' to which those pursuing genealogies of concept-formation and those registering promising empirical developments can agree. The volume does not start the debate about how to integrate empirical material into Critical Theory in critical times, but contains an invitation to continue it.

[1] Throughout the collection, Critical Theory is spelled with a small, not a capital C, to indicate the absence of any exclusionary or branding tendencies, but since this review is about its current state of the art, I take the liberty of capitalizing it.