Critical Theory to Structuralism: Philosophy, Politics, and the Human Sciences

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David Ingram (ed.), Critical Theory to Structuralism: Philosophy, Politics, and the Human Sciences, 343pp., vol. 5 of Alan D. Schrift (ed.), The History of Continental Philosophy (8 vols.), University of Chicago Press, 2010, 2700pp., $800.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226740461.

Reviewed by Richard Westerman, University of Alberta


According to Hegel, "the history of Philosophy is not a blind collection of fanciful ideas, nor a fortuitous progression," but rather a "necessary development of the successive philosophies from one another, so that the one of necessity presupposes another preceding it." In the end, a history of philosophy narrates the unfolding of "one Philosophy, the contemporary differences of which constitute the necessary aspects of the one principle." Hegel's strictures are perhaps particularly relevant for any history of continental philosophy: though it may be arguable whether the term refers to any coherent school, one thing that unites many of those identified as continental philosophers is that they develop their own ideas in direct engagement with the historical tradition.

Chicago's handsome new eight-volume History of Continental Philosophy is therefore a very welcome addition to the literature: their comprehensive catalogue of the "tradition that has its roots in several different ways of approaching and responding to Immanuel Kant's critical philosophy" will help both the novice and the specialist trace a path through the often-convoluted genealogies of contemporary continental philosophy. Whilst the publishers' website refers to the project as "the most comprehensive reference work to date," the Series Preface suggests an intention to follow Hegel's guidance. There, the series is described as "a coherent and comprehensive account of the continental philosophical tradition." The editors acknowledge that "telling the history of continental philosophy cannot simply take the form of a chronologically organized series of 'great thinker' essays." (pp. vii-viii)

David Ingram takes on the job of editing Volume Five of the collection -- a difficult task, since most of the writers covered in this volume did not treat philosophical problems in isolation, but instead both used philosophical ideas to interpret social and political problems and also tried to answer philosophical questions with reference to the social sciences. As he explains in a comprehensive, clear introduction, "the figures, schools of thought, and themes represented in this volume can best be understood as responses to this chronic crisis of modernity and, more specifically, the liberal state." (p. 1) Ingram rightly highlights the way this practical crisis led to a deeper philosophical scepticism about the value of reason. Hanging over this volume, then, is the fundamental question of disciplinary boundary: how far can normative philosophical arguments be applied to concrete social or political problems, and what is left to philosophy when other disciplines begin to answer some of its central questions?

Considered on their individual merits, and within the editorial constraints of the project, the essays are almost uniformly excellent. Each provides a clear, succinct summary of the writer at hand.  Though covering philosophers whose commitment to lucidity was not always beyond question, the contributors to this volume nevertheless manage to balance detail and comprehensibility with uncommon skill. Only William L. McBride's essay, 'French Marxism in its Heyday,' might have benefitted from a slightly heavier editorial hand.  Whilst McBride gives a readable, comprehensive summary of those philosophers who identified as Marxists or Communists, he is on occasion a little too nakedly partisan in favour of Sartre -- though not especially to the detriment of a lively and informative piece. Every chapter could confidently be recommended to those looking to learn more about the progenitors of some the key theoretical schools of our time.  Chicago is to be congratulated on assembling such an outstanding slate of writers.

The essays respond to Ingram's central question of philosophy's response to the failure of liberalism and reason in a variety of different ways. Some of the essays take a primarily intellectual-historical approach: broadly speaking, they suggest that their subjects' philosophical positions developed in response to specific historical developments, and they trace this development within a biographical framework. McBride's piece on French Marxism is one of these; he provides an interesting account of the responses of various philosophical Marxists to specific historical and political developments and shows how disagreements between these figures often took philosophical form.

As it happens, the other primarily historical papers all touch on the founding fathers of Critical Theory. John Abromeit's excellent piece on the origins of early Critical Theory accomplishes the remarkable task of doing this twice. He identifies three main currents in the formation of early Critical Theory: Max Horkheimer's early theory (supplemented by his collaboration with Erich Fromm), Herbert Marcuse's dialectical critique of rationality, and the work of Horkheimer in collaboration with Theodor Adorno. Tackling the first two, Abromeit gives clear, brisk, and impressively detailed accounts of Horkheimer's and Marcuse's developments. Abromeit is skilled at breaking down each thinker's work into its component parts and showing their connection with the rise of Nazism. Moreover, he gives a salutary reminder that Horkheimer produced very valuable work of his own, distinct from his work with Adorno -- whose own development is the subject of Deborah Cook's entry.

Cook rightly emphasises the continuity within Adorno's Critical Theory: tracing his development from the early 1930s, she convincingly refutes the vulgar assumption that Adorno and other early Critical Theorists were themselves anti-rational or anti-Enlightenment. She shows how each successive stage in Adorno's thinking represented a challenge to the particular forms of socialised reason in capitalist society -- but only in order to emphasise how radical the early Critical Theorists' proposals for a rationally organised society of free individuals really were. The one exception was, of course, early Critical Theory's tragic hero,Walter Benjamin. In his fascinating contribution, James McFarland explains that his choice of the biographical framework is necessitated by the unsystematic nature of Benjamin's thought.  By showing how his thought was the result of personal involvement in the crises of the time, McFarland fulfils his goal of renewing the "force of its emergence."

Together, Abromeit, Cook, and McFarland provide a useful, comprehensive, and clear account of the emergence of early Critical Theory against its historical background. Ingram indicates what happened next at the end of his own contribution on logical positivism and pragmatism. The latter in particular was pushed out of Anglo-American faculties for much of the twentieth century, but Ingram skillfully explains its development and key figures in a way that shows how the second generation of Critical Theorists, particularly Habermas, could draw on it for their own work.

A second group of essays provides synchronic accounts of the way specific thinkers tried to develop philosophically grounded diagnoses of the problems of the twentieth century. Chris Thornhill pulls together summaries of Carl Schmitt and aspects of Georg Lukács and Antonio Gramsci to highlight common themes in the critique of the liberal state. He highlights the complex web of connections between positivism, Kantianism, and the liberal state to set up his argumentative claim that Schmitt, Lukács, and Gramsci attacked the last of these through criticism of the first two. Thornhill's adumbration of the relation between liberalism, Kantianism, and positivism is masterful; he is particularly good in his summaries of Schmitt's works. Gramsci and Lukács perhaps suffer from the brevity with which they are treated, but Thornhill manages to highlight the salient aspects of their theory.

On similar lines, Peg Birmingham's outstanding chapter on Arendt takes a strongly conceptual approach. Rather than describing the historical development of Arendt's thought, Birmingham shows how different aspects of her theory at different times are in essence variations on a central theme: the failure of liberalism to provide an adequate space for political action. Birmingham's focus ensures a clear answer to the question of how to formulate a philosophical response to social and political challenges.

Given the task of covering a broad range of authors, Lewis R. Gordon did not have this option open to him for his superb chapter on "Black Existentialism," which does exactly what one might hope. Gordon begins with a few succinct suggestions as to why existentialism held a particular attraction for a broad range of black writers in the 1940s and 1950s in articulating their criticisms of racist power structures. His overview of existentialism in literature covers a great deal of ground in a small space, and his account of Fanon clearly shows the connections between philosophy and socio-political criticism.

The final group includes those contributions that are most interested in the way developments in other disciplines, such as psychology or linguistics, challenged the traditional philosophical categories most relevant to liberalism. Thomas F. Braden gives a useful account of Ferdinand de Saussure's linguistic structuralism.  A brief biographical sketch prefaces a good reconstruction of the central claims and concepts of Saussure's General Course.  The piece concludes with an overview of developments in structural linguistics after Saussure. Given Saussure's own work, Braden is necessarily focused on linguistics as a science, but he takes care to indicate how linguistic structuralism contributes to the decentring of the rational subject of post-Cartesian philosophy initiated by Nietzsche, Freud, and Marx.

Braden's piece works well to set up both Brian C. Singer's essay on Claude Lévi-Strauss and Ed Pluth's account of Jacques Lacan. Singer and Pluth do excellent jobs.  Each explicitly tackles the question of what philosophy can learn from two thinkers who criticised the discipline's claims. Singer gives lucid summaries of the technicalities of Lévi-Strauss's anthropological oeuvre in a way that effectively highlights its implications for philosophy and Lévi-Strauss's own interests in aesthetics and morality. Pluth is even more focused on the implications of Lacan's thought for the philosophical idea of the subject.  Adroitly picking a clear path through this densest of thinkers, he shows well how Lacanian theory poses fundamental challenges for conventional philosophy. Together, the three essays on Saussue, Lévi-Strauss, and Lacan work well to show how the introduction of structuralist thought in the social sciences led to serious questions for pure philosophy.

Peter Tracy Connor's chapter on Georges Bataille takes a similar approach: he manages to bring forth the philosophy underlying an apparently anti-philosophical thinker. Bataille's paeans to destruction or pure experiences are explained through his belief in the inadequacy of language to encapsulate them properly. Connor succeeds admirably in showing his readers why this represents a fundamental challenge to conventional philosophy.

So: a collection of high-quality individual essays, each of which is characterised by clarity and rigour, and several of which work together to provide a good overview of philosophical schools. Still, I was left with a sense that the book could have gone further. Despite the statement in the Preface that a series of essays on great thinkers is not the best way to go about writing a history of philosophy, this is, in the end, what this volume consists of. It is a good work of reference, providing effective introductions to these key thinkers -- though in the age of internet resources from Wikipedia to the Stanford Encyclopedia, one wonders how many undergraduates will make their way to the library for short introductory essays such as these. (It would be to the undergraduates' loss, of course.) But taking the book as a history, the reader is constantly aware of stories not told because it is structured around individual writers. This takes different forms depending on the type of essay. For example, it would have been good to allow some overlap between the historical chapters. Abromeit identifies Adorno as a key strand in early Critical Theory -- but because Cook covers Adorno, we are deprived of the chance to see how Abromeit would have drawn his three strands together. A little overlap would not have been to the detriment of Cook, whose emphasis is on Adorno's more philosophical thought rather than his social theory.

In other places, the writer-by-writer structure constrains efforts to answer the central question. Thornhill's piece on Schmitt, Lukács, and Gramsci does reflect interestingly on Ingram's problem of the failures of liberalism. But it is not clear why these three writers in particular should be treated together. Thornhill himself remarks that the relation between them is one of parallels, rather than dialogue; he notes that Otto Kirchheimer was perhaps the early Western Marxist most closely aligned with Schmitt. One is left with the impression that Thornhill has been asked to include something about Lukács and Gramsci, rather than being allowed to develop his argument by looking at the writers he sees most fit for the purpose. That he nevertheless manages to bring a coherent case together is to his credit.

Finally, the rigid separation of chapters often leads to a sense of stories untold or connections unexplored. For example, the chapters on Adorno, Benjamin, and Bataille all touch on the way in which these thinkers came to question language itself in such a way that it was impossible for them to present their ideas in conventional philosophical form as a series of propositional claims. But because the book is structured around individual writers, there is no scope to discuss the way different authors explored a question that is central to understanding why so much continental philosophy is deliberately elliptical.

Of course, neither writers nor editor can be faulted for these problems: they seem to stem from the structure of the series as a whole. But these issues do return us to Hegel's thoughts on what a history of philosophy should look like.  It should try to find some unity in the story it tells, showing how central questions unfold with a necessity of their own. The task might have been accomplished by removing the author-per-essay structure in favour of a series of themed essays examining the emergence and development of particular questions, along the lines of what Thornhill aims for in his piece on Schmitt, Lukács, and Gramsci. For example, the similarities referred to above between Adorno, Benjamin, and Bataille could have formed the basis of an article exploring why this particular problem of language began to trouble so many thinkers.

Another method would have been to separate out the German and French traditions. Volume Six in the series deals with later Critical Theory in Germany and Poststructuralism in France; the division between Five and Six is therefore chronological. But the reader here is left with a strong impression of two separate stories, one in Frankfurt, the other in Paris. By treating all of the Frankfurt School to the present day (or at least as far as Habermas) in one volume, and the French tradition in another, it would have been possible to show how and why the questions central to each group of thinkers were formulated and developed. The decision to divide the volumes by time period makes this longer narrative impossible. Either way would, I think, have allowed the consistencies and connections across continental philosophers to stand out more clearly -- and might even have helped us answer the vexed question of whether the term actually refers to anything more than philosophy done on the mainland of Europe.

Nevertheless, it would be wrong to condemn the book for what it might have tried to do, rather than what it actually is. The University of Chicago Press has performed a great service for continental philosophy in making this series available, and this volume is an excellent addition to the collection. Every one of the essays provides a clear and concise introduction to its subject, and perhaps even my gripes themselves only indicate how thought-provoking many of them were. Ingram has done sterling editorial work; he and his stable of contributors have produced an invaluable work of reference and a most stimulating introduction to the way continental philosophy responded to the problems faced by liberal-capitalist societies in the early twentieth century.