Critique and Disclosure: Critical Theory between Past and Future

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Nikolas Kompridis, Critique and Disclosure: Critical Theory between Past and Future, MIT Press, 2006, 333pp., $37.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780262112994.

Reviewed by Fred Dallmayr, University of Notre Dame


The fate of reason today hangs in the balance. This is no small matter. Ever since its historical beginnings, reason or rationality has been the central focus and point of honor of Western modernity -- a focus enshrined in Descartes' cogito, Enlightenment rationalism, and Kantian (and neo-Kantian) critical philosophy. The result of this focus was an asymmetrical dichotomy: separated from the external world of "matter" (or nature), the cogito assumed the role of superior task master and overseer -- a role fueling the enterprise of modern science and technology. During the past century, the edifice of Western modernity has registered a trembling, due to both internal and external contestations. Subverting the modern asymmetry, a host of thinkers – with views ranging from American pragmatism to European life philosophy and phenomenology -- have endeavored to restore pre-cognitive "experience" (including sense perception and affect) to its rightful place. In the context of French "postmodernism," a prominent battle cry has been to dislodge "logocentrism" (the latter term often equated with anthropocentrism). In the ambiance of recent German philosophy, the battle lines have been clearly marked: pitting champions of modern rationalism, represented by Jürgen Habermas, against defenders of experiential "world disclosure," represented by Martin Heidegger. In his book, Nikolas Kompridis endeavors to shed new light on this controversy, with the aim not so much of bringing about a cease fire but of providing resources for arriving at better mutual understanding.

Kompridis does not exactly assume a position above the contestants (he repeatedly rejects the "view from nowhere"). As the book's subtitle indicates, his point of departure is "critical theory" as championed by the Frankfurt School, and his attempt is to nudge that theory beyond a certain rationalist orthodoxy in the direction of possible "future" horizons. While appreciating some of its merits -- such as the "linguistic turn" and the emphasis on "communicative" rationality -- Kompridis finds Habermas's reformulation of the Frankfurt program on the whole unhelpful and debilitating. In his words (p. 17): "For all there is to recommend it, Habermas's reformulation has produced a split between new and old critical theory so deep that the identity and future of critical theory are at risk." The main reason is that the "normative gain" deriving from the linguistic turn remains attached to narrow rationalist premises that have "needlessly devalued" the theory's potential. In Kompridis's view, Habermas's evolving thought exhibits a break or rupture (quite apart from the linguistic turn): namely, a move toward pure "theory" which happened soon after the publication of Knowledge and Human Interests. "That turn to theory," he writes (pp. 232-234), "refashioned the project of critical theory as a strenge Wissenschaft, less bound by or beholden to the historical and existential exigencies of modernity" -- thereby undermining modernity's intrinsic "relation to time." As a result of this refashioning, critical theory was catapulted in the direction of an abstractly rational universalism disdainful of cultural and practical modes of pluralism. The upshot was a growing "insensitivity to particularity," justifying the suspicion that the basic concepts of communicative rationality had from the start been "rigged in favor of the universal." But, the book adds sharply, "a provinciality-destroying reason is a meaning-destroying reason" and the latter is "a history-destroying reason."

Considerations of this kind serve to buttress the book's basic "thesis" (p. 17) that Habermas's reformulation is "in need of urgent reassessment if critical theory is to have a future worthy of its past." In Kompridis's view (pp. 28-29), critical theory's renewal has to rely on alternative resources, including insights "central to the German tradition from Hegel to Heidegger and Adorno" and phenomenological explorations of the "life-world." In this context, a crucial resource is Heidegger's notion of "world disclosure," articulated variously under the labels of "Erschlossenheit," "Lichtung," and "Ereignis." The basic point of the notion of disclosure is that "we operate 'always already' with a pre-reflective, holistically structured, and grammatically regulated understanding of the world" (pp. 32-33) -- which means that our thinking and reasoning is always embedded in a pre-cognitive experiential setting. In Heidegger's own terms: If there is to be any understanding of something "as something," then "our understanding must itself somehow see as disclosed that upon which it projects." The implications of this insight are obviously immense and bound to reverberate through all modes of philosophizing, including critical theory. Kompridis is by no means naïve about the obstacles facing the recuperation of Heideggerian insights. As he writes (p. 32): "The idea that Heidegger's thought can contribute to the renewal of critical theory is more likely to be greeted with disbelief (if not derision) than with curiosity." For, as is well known, "Heidegger's person and his thought have played the role of critical theory's 'other': he is the very antithesis of the critical intellectual as critical theorists imagine 'him'." Not daunted by these obstacles, Kompridis wagers that the benefits of the recuperation outweigh possible drawbacks. "Rather than regarding it as a threat to reason, as Habermas does," he states (p. 38), "I will argue that disclosure presents us with the possibility of a new, practice-altering conception of reason, a conception upon which the basis for an alternative model of critical theory can emerge."

In the book's second Part ("Dependent Freedom"), Kompridis seeks to retrieve crucial aspects of Heidegger's work and rescue them from various misreadings -- especially Habermas's charges of "methodological solipsism" and a relapse into "subjectivity." As Kompridis tries to show (pp. 44-46), the salient difference between Being and Time and Habermas's own project is "not between subject-centeredness and intersubjectivity" but rather between the former's focus on "semantic" criteria -- how something becomes mutually intelligible -- and the latter's stress on "justificatory" and "context-transcending" criteria. The difference can also be articulated in terms of the primacy granted respectively to "meaning" or universal "validity." A central Heideggerian teaching lifted up in this context is his notion of "solicitude" and especially of "anticipatory-liberating solicitude" -- a notion which clearly conflicts with subject-centeredness. For Kompridis (p. 49), the notion accentuates how "our freedom for self-determination … is both dependent on and facilitated, not just impeded, by our relation to others" -- which means that "the condition under which the other and I can realize our freedom are conditions that must be cooperatively established, preserved, and enlarged." Another important Heideggerian term is "Entschlossenheit" or "resoluteness." As Kompridis insists (p. 58), contra Habermas, the term is "not synonymous with decision or decisiveness, or a manly readiness to take action"; rather, it resonates "with Erschlossenheit, with disclosure or disclosedness." Hence, a better translation would be "unclosednness" which draws attention to "the receptive [though not purely passive] character" of our activity. Refreshingly unconventional are also Kompridis's comments on "das Man." Countering widespread prejudices, he argues (pp. 71-74) that Heidegger's category "displays no more contempt for 'average everydayness' … than is to be found in Rousseau's Second Discourse, Emerson's 'Self-Reliance', Thoreau's Walden, or Mill's On Liberty." Specifically, Heidegger is not advocating "an interpretation of 'authenticity' in terms of radical individuality," but rather is guided by an interest "in recovering the everyday, rescuing its semantic resources from daily degradation."

In the third Part Kompridis discusses some of the main strategies employed by critical theorists to debunk Heideggerian "disclosure," by removing it to a realm outside of reason. He conveniently lists Habermas's main objections (p. 98): that Heideggerian ontology "dictates history", that disclosure "precludes the very possibility of learning", and that it is not prior to but "subordinate" to validity claims. For Kompridis, "all of these criticisms fail, often by their own lights," so that Habermas's meta-critique of disclosure "turns out to be rather incoherent." One strategy used to obviate disclosure is to relegate it to a purely "aesthetic" domain, that is, the "value sphere" of art and literature stipulated by Habermas; in that sphere, rational validity "goes on holiday." The strategy fails for the simple reason that disclosure undercuts the division of value spheres (p. 109): "The very idea of an independent sphere of value organized around the world-disclosing practices of art and literature is incoherent." Similarly misguided is the identification of disclosure with an "extraordinary" event or capacity. In Kompridis's words (pp. 112-123), what is neglected here is that "the success of everyday practice depends on the world-illuminating, problem-solving power of disclosure." Hence, Habermas's misconstrual reflects precisely "an inattentiveness to the presence of the extraordinary in the everyday." Other tactics found in critical theory's arsenal are the "debunking strategy" directed mainly at the notion of "ontological difference" (which silently remains presupposed) and the "annexing strategy" where disclosure is somehow assimilated to validation. What all these strategies miss is what Kompridis calls the "test of disclosure" (p. 142). The latter is tested "not against the world as it is, but as it might be; [hence] any new disclosure of meaning and possibility is underdetermined by the 'world'."

In the fourth Part, Kompridis defends a broad conception of "philosophy" transgressing the boundaries of Habermasian rationalism and proceduralism. From the procedural angle, Kompridis asserts (p. 149), philosophy is restricted to "a definition of argument so narrowly 'professional' as to be unphilosophical"; in fact, a history of philosophy employing the procedural criterion "would be a very short, colorless history." A main target of critique in this context is Habermas's definition of philosophy as a "stand-in" (that is, place-keeper for science) and as interpreter -- a definition which Kompridis considers lopsided and untenable (p. 161):

The more it is scrutinized, the more this whole mixed-up conception of philosophy … appears to be the product of an expert-culture mentality, exhibiting that mentality's tendency to think in terms of highly distinct 'specializations' and roles within an insufficiently examined division of labor.

A corollary of proceduralism is the rigid distinction of philosophy from literature. Again, Kompridis's response is pointed (p. 178): "Pace Habermas, what distinguishes philosophy from literature is not that the former is a problem-solving enterprise while the latter is a world-disclosing enterprise" -- a spurious distinction "since there is no way to separate world-disclosure from problem-solving in the relevant instances." Above all, what proceduralism and the focus on rationalist theory occlude is philosophy's integral relation to praxis and the practical disclosure of a possible future. Taking a leaf from American pragmatism, Kompridis states (p. 167) that "philosophy receives its concept of itself from the needs of its time, and it is from the quality of philosophy's response to these needs that it can be in a position to react responsibly as an agency of critical enlightenment."

The exploration of possible horizons occupies the remainder of the book. For Kompridis (pp. 192-193), Habermasian thought is not sufficiently open to these horizons because it tolerates only "change that is both familiar to us and controllable by us." To be sure, openness or Erschlossenheit needs to be distinguished from random plasticity, from "contemporary culture's drunken infatuation with the promise of limitless freedom." At that point, Hannah Arendt's theory of action becomes relevant with its accent on radical, but ongoing and sustainable, transformation. In the same manner, Heideggerian disclosive praxis can fruitfully be invoked. In this domain, the charge of "fatalism" often leveled against him serves as a "distorting lens." In one of his most innovative moves, Kompridis links disclosure and "letting be" not with passivity but with a "receptivity" sustaining non-domineering action. "Both Heidegger's early and later writings," he observes (pp. 202-203), "offer a promising starting point for understanding how cooperative, accountable practices of reflective disclosure can facilitate new cultural beginnings, initiate new practices, and found new institutions." What is required here is a rethinking of "agency," away from the deeds of heroic overmen and pointing in a new and "unfamiliar direction": a direction "not only decentering but also reconfiguring what it means to be an agent." Such rethinking makes it possible to see "human beings as cooperative facilitators rather than heroic creators of new beginnings." As has to be admitted, Heidegger did not always live up to the potential of his thought (as shown in his temporary attachment to an ideology which demanded "closed, not open minds"). Intimately associated with this receptive mode of agency is Heidegger's view of human interaction informed by "solicitude." Going beyond narrow formulations of "recognition," recognizing the other from Heidegger's angle involves "a struggle in which one's own self-understanding … [is] at stake. That is why such a struggle for recognition is at once cognitive and affective" (p. 210). By contrast to a purely cerebral or "notional" construal, "genuine experiences of self-decentering involve and challenge all of our cognitive and affective capacities, our whole sensibility" (p. 214).

In the concluding sixth Part, Kompridis's focus is entirely on open possibilities "in times of need." He complains first of all of the prevailing cultural skepticism and the apparent "exhaustion of utopian energies": "Skepticism and despair seem to have outstripped hope" (pp. 245-247). This situation is detrimental to philosophy per se, but especially to an outlook which claims to be "critical" of unexamined conditions. "Critique," he states (p. 252), "is unavoidably 'utopian', not in the sense that it depends on the availability of a fully determinate utopia, but in that it depends on the openness and receptivity of the future to utopian thought." The recovery of this dimension requires the restoration of "trust" and confidence in available possibilities. Returning to the book's central theme, and differentiating between pre-reflective and reflective disclosure, Kompridis at this point defines disclosure as a kind of "intimate" or "immanent" critique and critique as the practice of reflective disclosure. In his words (p. 255): "The goal of critique should aim at the self-decentering disclosure of meaning and possibility… . Ultimately the test of any newly disclosed possibilities is the degree to which they can initiate self-decentering learning that makes a cooperative new beginning possible." Again, beginning anew here does not coincide with a rupture entirely forgetful of the past. Invoking both Marcuse and Walter Benjamin, Kompridis stresses the need to "preserve the unclosedness of the past" precisely in order to preserve the openness of the future. (A similar point can be found in Heidegger's notion of "the future of the past.") Such an outlook, he writes (pp. 270-272), protects against both reactionary nostalgia and vanguardist euphoria: "It is absolutely essential to the success of possibility-disclosing critique that it lets itself be permeated with the potential of what could be different," and this means "letting oneself suffer one's time, making oneself vulnerable to it by letting oneself be marked by it." By way of conclusion -- and invoking Heidegger's writings on Hölderlin -- Kompridis asserts the need to revive the legacy of a "suppressed romanticism" (p. 275): "In my view, romanticism is not just some superseded period of cultural history; it is the frequently unacknowledged position from which we engage in a critical, time-sensitive interpretation of the present."

This is an important and timely (or time-sensitive) book, both in philosophical and in practical-political terms. Today its plea for a recovery of trust in the future has gained unexpectedly broad resonance. Philosophically, the book in a way signals the end of a period marked by divergent, even opposite tendencies: on the one hand, the "postmodern" fascination with "extraordinary" rupture (or rapture), and on the other, the streamlining of critical theory in the mold of a rule-governed, rationalist normalcy. The book's basic aim -- one which I heartily endorse -- is to rescue critical thought from these limiting parameters and thus to nurture openness for new possibilities. My sympathy with this aim is in part motivated by my own similar endeavors to open critical theory to Heideggerian insights (see, e.g., my Between Freiburg and Frankfurt: Toward a Critical Ontology, of 1991). Like Kompridis, I had been chagrined by Habermas's abandonment of his earlier practical engaged outlook in favor of abstract theorizing; Kompridis's comments on the flaws of such theorizing are pointed and basically on target. Of late, it is true, Habermasian thought seems to have undergone a certain mellowing, softening the harsh edges of his abstract universalism and moving him closer again to hermeneutics and even to modes of religious thought (although the name of Heidegger remains banished from his discourse). Despite such recent modifications, however, the book performs a valuable function: nudging rank-and-file critical theorists away from certain "orthodox" school positions which Habermas himself seems now ready to abandon.

There are numerous other features of the book -- a veritable cornucopia -- with which I heartily agree. One has to do with the reformulation of praxis in terms of a decentered receptivity and open engagement with others. This reformulation gives a crucial new impulse to conventional "action theory," pushing it beyond the confines of self-centered activism and passive self-erasure. In my own thinking, I have tended to view Heideggerian solicitude and "letting be" as prime examples of (what is often called) the "middle voice." The accent on receptivity or receptive generosity also reveals important dimensions of a Heideggerian "ethics" -- dimensions which are usually sidelined or ignored. This neglect is astonishing in view of such salient Heideggerian terms as "solicitude" and especially "anticipatory-liberating solicitude" -- as Kompridis correctly observes. The topics of receptivity and engaged solicitude have a clear bearing on the traditional notion of inter-human recognition -- a notion which, in the past, has often been confined to a purely cerebral level. The reformulation of this concept in terms of a re-connection of cognition with affect and sensibility can obviously rely on the Heideggerian category of "Stimmung," but beyond that on a longer tradition stretching from Spinoza to Emerson, Merleau-Ponty, and Stanley Cavell. Extremely valuable in this context are also Kompridis's comments on the broader social import of self-decentering. As he writes (p. 213), such self-decentering

is not about overcoming our partial view of things in order to arrive at the single right answer to a moral problem. It is not about a 'transcendence' of our parochial self in order to achieve an impartial or objective view of things; it is about an enlargement of self, opening it up to what was previously closed.

In conformity with these comments, Kompridis's view of "utopia" does not involve a bland universalism or cosmopolitanism. What Heideggerian disclosure brings into view, he states (pp. 219-220), is the need to change a monistic conception of being "into a pluralistic one, such that we acquire an increased sensitivity to the presence and endangered state of plural 'local worlds' -- plural understandings not subsumable under a single notion of being." What this underscores is "the interdependent relationship between intelligibility, plurality, and possibility."

Despite my general agreement with the book's orientation, I cannot refrain from voicing some reservations. Although lucidly written, the presentation is often somewhat rambling and repetitive; a tightening of structure might have further strengthened its argument. More serious are reservations having to do with the portrayal of Heidegger's thought. Despite his initial rejection of the Habermasian charges of solipsism and a relapse into the "philosophy of the subject," Kompridis surprisingly ends up echoing these charges in slightly revised form. The section on "Dependent Freedom" castigates the "conspicuous lack of a normatively robust conception of intersubjective accountability and recognition" (p. 48). In large measure, this lack is blamed on Heidegger's allegedly self-centered conception of Entschlossenheit and the "call of conscience." Despite his own translation of Entschlossenheit as "unclosedness," and in the face of a quoted passage where Heidegger describes the "call of conscience" as a call that comes "from me and yet from outside and beyond me," Kompridis states (p. 51):

Regrettably Heidegger chose to develop the meaning of 'resoluteness' one-sidedly, as an openness or receptivity to a 'call' whose disclosed meaning should be understood independently of our relation to others. Thus he made monophonic and monological a call that is inherently polyphonic and dialogical.

From here it is only a short step to the claim (pp. 52-53), that Heidegger decided to "suppress that half of the 'call' that emanates from outside the self," with the result that Being and Time culminates in "a solipsistic rather than a 'fundamental' ontology" hovering at "the precarious edge of subjectivism." A similar re-vindication concerns Habermas's charge of decisionism. Although strongly asserting that "Entschlossenheit is not synonymous with decision," Kompridis in effect revokes his assertion by stating (p. 65) that "Heidegger undermines the illuminating power of his own analyses by uncoupling Entschlossenheit from Dasein's positive dependence on others and thus from positive solicitude." Painting with a broad brush, even Heidegger's famous "turning" (Kehre) is interpreted (p. 67) as "the successful suppression of dependence on others."

In my view, assertions of this kind could easily be corrected by a closer reading of Heidegger's texts, especially his Beiträge and some lecture courses presented during the 1930's (and only recently made available). Less easily resolvable is the central issue announced in the book's title: the relation between critique and disclosure. As one can gather from the subtitle and numerous other statements, the basic tendency is to subordinate disclosure to critique, that is, to make disclosure serviceable to critical theory. As Kompridis states at one point (pp. 31-32): "What I propose to draw from Heidegger does not require abandonment of Habermas's best critical insights; rather, it means reassessing them and recombining them with Heidegger's in order to re-envision the future of critical theory." Yet, taking into account the sustained criticisms of Habermas throughout the book, how plausible or persuasive is this aim? In his most exacting or developed formulations, Kompridis defines critique as reflective disclosure and disclosure as intimate critique (pp. 238, 255). But what about "pre-reflective disclosure"? Would it not be more plausible and sensible to assign critique to what some writers call "secondary reflection" (and Kompridis "reflective disclosure")? Ever since the time of Kant, modern philosophy has been defined or defined itself preeminently as "critique" -- a primacy the book seems to accept. In my opinion, however, Heidegger's work does not entirely subscribe to this tradition; it is not primarily critical, but rather ontological and phenomenological -- honoring Merleau-Ponty's notion of the primacy of "perceptual faith." Looked at from this angle, the title of the book might perhaps preferably read: Disclosure and Critique.