Critique of Forms of Life

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Rahel Jaeggi, Critique of Forms of Life, Ciaran Cronin (tr.), Harvard University Press, 2018, 395pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674737754.

Reviewed by Todd Hedrick, Michigan State University


When Theodor Adorno calls modern life "damaged" in Minima Moralia, he is saying something not easily captured in terms of either a functionalist critique or a straightforwardly moral or ethical one. His point, rather, seems to be that, at a very ordinary and basic level, our established ways of doing things frustrate any desires we might have to live freely and well. Adorno's portrayal of this damage gathers in a bewildering array of topics -- from interior design, to gifting, to horoscopes -- because he cleaves to a notion of totality inherited from Marx and Hegel: the variegated habits, mores, sensibilities, and institutions of modern life comprise a unity, or social whole, by virtue of all being shaped by and reinforcing an underlying logic of abstraction and instrumental exchange. As later Frankfurt School critical theorists like J├╝rgen Habermas and Axel Honneth grew suspicious of the concept of totality's sociological bona fides, they sought instead to ground critique in putatively fundamental modes of social integration -- namely, Habermas' theory of communicative action and Honneth's theory of recognition. The fine-grained examination of everyday practices that Adorno undertook drops out of their conceptions of critique, since particular facets of late capitalist life cannot, for them, be taken to stand for the falsity and wrongness of the social whole, as they did for Adorno. This methodological shift has tended to consign forms of life to what Rahel Jaeggi calls a "black box" (x), insulated from critique. As a result, critique threatens to become disconnected from the source of many people's concrete concerns, motivations, and self-conceptions (9) -- a deficit that Rahel Jaeggi aims to rectify in her book.

Over the last 15 or so years, Jaeggi has emerged as one of the most interesting philosophers working in Germany, and this exciting book, by inaugurating a distinct paradigm of critical theory, should cement her status as a leading light of the Frankfurt School tradition. While Jaeggi anticipated this project years ago, in an article sympathetically reconstructing Adorno's method of immanently critiquing forms of life,[1] Adorno's unrelenting negativism is here set aside in favor of a "dialectical pragmatism" inspired first and foremost by Hegel (with additional accents provided by John Dewey and Alasdair MacIntyre), which establishes a basis for deeming forms of life's transformations to, under certain conditions, be progressive and emancipatory "learning processes". This programmatic work is remarkably successful in establishing a framework for critical theory to engage with the expansive layer of society between state, politics, and law, on the one hand, and the underlying structural dynamics of the economy, on the other. Moreover, it does so without yoking itself to either a moral theory standing over and above the practices in question (a strategy shunned by the entire left Hegelian tradition, Jaeggi included), or a notion of totality that many philosophers and social theorists would today be reluctant to employ. While some readers will be disappointed that it does not deliver the kind of Zeitdiagnose that they may expect, and leaves hanging some questions about the scope of critique that it allows, it will likely, and deservedly, become a frequently cited model for future work in critical theory, and is a thought-provoking and challenging study in its own right, of interest to those working on social ontology, pragmatism, Hegelian thought, and issues around idealism and materialism, in addition to critical theorists.

Jaeggi's book is comprised of ten chapters that are divided into four parts. She begins, in the introduction, by pushing back against John Rawls' and Habermas' doctrines of "ethical abstinence", in which actions, laws, etc., that transgress morally valid principles are legitimate targets of criticism, while forms of life are seen as ethical and cultural particulars that are not subject to rational evaluation. Jaeggi notes that the location of any boundary between ethics and morality is hardly self-evident, and has to be drawn using existing practices of inquiry (that is, within the horizon of a form of life) (17); and in any event, modern societies are ineluctably reliant upon the public regulation of everyday life, such that all of us -- whether we like it, and are aware of it, or not -- are indelibly shaped by things like traffic patterns, child rearing practices, career arcs, public architecture, leisure habits, and so on. In other words, while forms of life are rarely straightforwardly immoral or unjust, they are nevertheless matters of capital public concern, which require thoughtful critique and transformation, if we want to see our way toward a better, free, more just world.

The first two parts expound what we might think of as Jaeggi's social ontology, and I reckon that the majority of her substantially original contributions are contained herein. Jaeggi first lays out her conception of forms of life, i.e., their typical and defining features. She argues that forms of life should be understood as "ensembles of social practices" (7), and later, functionally defines these ensembles as "problem solving entities" (133). She also characterizes the particular kind of normativity attaching to forms of life, that is, the sense in which we should think of them as posing rationally evaluable claims, and the concomitant kind of critique appropriate to entities making such claims. Forms of life are, according to Jaeggi, shared, interrelated sets of practices that exert what is usually an informal, subtle form of normative pressure to do things the right/appropriate way (106) -- they are ways of doing things together over some domain of sufficient breadth to be non-trivial. While I lack the space to recount how Jaeggi distinguishes forms of life from their relatives like culture, custom, institutions, and ethical life, or how she contrasts them with more fleeting phenomena like lifestyles, fashion, and sub-cultures, it does warrant mentioning that individuals typically inhabit multiple forms of life, which vary widely in terms of their generality, scope, how easy they are to opt in and out of, and their functional importance in overall societal reproduction. A married, ex-Army doctor living in a retirement community on the outskirts of Dallas, for instance, might simultaneously participate in the Texan, American military, middle class professional, senior citizen, urban/suburban, and bourgeois family forms of life. So, while questions about whether something is a form of life (e.g., as opposed to, say, a niche sub-culture) are subject to interpretive controversies that cannot be settled from a view from nowhere, Jaeggi maintains that forms of life can be formally characterized in a way that lends rationality to such debates.

To appreciate the distinctiveness of Jaeggi's social ontology, it may be helpful to contrast it with some of its close competitors, namely, Habermas' discourse theory, Honneth's neo-Hegelian theory of ethical life, and historical materialism. For Jaeggi, forms of life make up a thick level of social reality that largely comprises the water we swim in, so to speak, while navigating everyday life -- like Habermas' "lifeworld", they are mostly habitual, operating through know-how more than know-that, while nevertheless being reflectively thematize-able. Interpreters who are motivated by a need to figure out how to go on, once their practices have been disrupted or are otherwise starting to seem "uninhabitable", construe those practices as problem solving entities: they represent established ways of doing things (e.g., eating, raising children, managing urban growth, etc.) that "solve" problems emerging from a form of life's previous iterations -- in this sense, forms of life confront "second order problems" (163), arising in part from the normative expectations they inculcate. Compared to the positions listed above, Jaeggi's theory is more thoroughly constructivist: she does not assume that "problems" must take any anthropologically fixed form (144), in the way that, say, historical materialism might insist that they arise from organizing production to satisfy human needs, or how Honneth would argue that they can be traced to struggles over standard types of social recognition. When emphasizing practices' similarity to games, Jaeggi is contending that practices are constituted by rules that are, at some level, simply posited in order to make the practices function (106). As such, her theory looks to be less cognitivist than Habermas', which holds that the communicatively organized lifeworld is reproduced through types of discourse that are rational by virtue of conforming to a structure of quasi-transcendental practical presuppositions. Although Jaeggi does not heavily advertise it, it seems to me that her theory is designed to establish an immanent basis for social critique that does not presuppose or rely on any particular philosophical anthropology, metaphysical theory of history, or theory of rationality, not to mention moral theory. Given that the major sticking points in Habermas' and Honneth's critical theories have tended to concern the soundness and supposed universality of these elements in their theories, pulling this off would be a significant coup.

Is Jaeggi able to do so? The answer would be negative, if the model of "internal criticism" -- i.e., criticism that draws only on a given society's own norms and values -- were the only genuinely immanent conception of critique. In the third section, Jaeggi makes a common appraisal of internal criticism as limited and conservative. She adds, however, that internal criticism misses the "normatively constituted" nature of social reality (164). Forms of life are not, in the first instance, outgrowths of value commitments, and Jaeggi rejects a strongly teleological conception of practices that she associates with Honneth and a version of Hegel, wherein the implicit goal of modern social practices is to actualize the value of freedom. Jaeggi does think that practices are teleological in that they have "purposes" (59), and is not denying that purposes need to be interpreted in light of animating values, but rather that practices are not engineered specifically to realize agreed upon values. This is a subtle difference, but the upshot is significant: Jaeggi thinks that, as problem solving entities, forms of life are not to be criticized as hypocritical (i.e., for not realizing the values that they are nominally committed to), but rather for "not working" -- where "working" involves a blend of functional and valuational considerations. When they are criticizable, practices are failing to realize their purposes in a good, satisfying way, because of the way they function. This, Jaeggi claims, is the core meaning of Hegel's characterization of things that "do not correspond to their concept" (119): this is a kind of normative failure tied to the contradictory nature of the social reality forms of life create, and not to the existence of a bridgeable gap between values and reality.

The fourth part of the book is a bit more expository than the rest, as much of it is occupied with reading Dewey, MacIntyre, and Hegel in order to argue that forms of life are subject to internally motivated transformations that, when they can be fairly construed as learning processes, are progressive and emancipatory. The basic idea here, as I understand it, is twofold: first, Jaeggi contends that an adequate theory ought to be able to explain forms of life's identity in difference, that is, how they can retain their identity through transformations (227); for example, how kinds of intimate groupings that we might today say "work" -- and work well -- as families can actually be families, even though they would not have been recognized as such by past identifying conventions. MacIntyre, Jaeggi thinks, supplies a useful criterion of "retrospective narrative reintegration" to characterize this continuity (286). Second, the theory must comprehend how forms of life can reconstitute themselves by processing their experience of crisis (as opposed to falling apart and becoming something else) -- forms of life that systematically restrict or undermine the self-reflection needed in order to do this are ideological. Here, Jaeggi turns to Hegel's ideas of contradiction and determinate negation: according to her (in some of the more idealist moments of the book), Hegel rightly recognizes that social reality is normatively constituted and that, therefore, "forms of life are not so much confronted with problems as that they pose problems for themselves" (266). Hereabouts, Jaeggi makes an interesting contribution to the well-worn problem of theory's relationship to practice: she argues that "dialectical" transformations -- i.e., ones that preserve identity through difference -- require theory (191), since to be productive, contradictions must be recognized as contradictions (as opposed to tensions, bad luck, etc.) by the form of life in question, and that recognizing contradictions requires grasping social reality as normatively constituted (and hence, changeable), which is, in turn, a consciousness of freedom -- the in-itself becoming the for-itself, in Hegel's terms.

Let me close by teasing out what I take to be some of the implications of tying critique to contradiction and crisis in forms of life, most of which I am reasonably well-disposed toward, but which I suspect will be less welcome to other readers. First, like most critical theories that stress immanence, it is not clear that Jaeggi's can transcend society's current normative horizon. Just as Habermas' critical theory (to the frustration of many) seems to restrict the possibility of felicitous social transformation to responses to felt disruptions wrought by "the colonization of the lifeworld", for Jaeggi, critique is only initiated by disruptions or pathologies that can be formulated as contradictions, and cannot project itself very far beyond them. For instance, say that modern societies are experiencing a crisis of work (due to automation, the prevalence of insecure, seemingly meaningless service employment, etc.): one possible response is to try to imagine a "post-work" society, that is, one in which basic needs are met and people no longer seek self-worth through careers, earning wages, etc. Whatever the merits of such ideas, they do not so much solve the problem of how to make work "work", as seek to erase or transcend the problem, leaping past the dialectical working through of contradiction, which, for Jaeggi, is the real business of critique.

Moreover, since critique commences with the recognition of contradiction, we need to be able to convincingly attribute social problems to contradictions and locate those contradictions within specific forms of life. But Jaeggi's theory does not render this an easy task. She describes her position as pragmatist partially because she rejects the "overdetermination" in Hegel (243), wherein parts of society are what they are by virtue of their relationship to the whole -- she instead accepts a plurality of overlapping, loosely interrelated forms of life. There are certainly good reasons for this, yet it can make determining what is and is not a contradiction a murky matter. Jaeggi refers repeatedly to Hegel's reflections on the moral and functional problems that poverty and unemployment ("the rabble") pose for civil society as a prime example of crisis and contradiction. Yet for Hegel, civil society is not itself a form of life, but a moment of modern ethical life. He recognizes that civil society has disintegrative, self-undermining tendencies; but he also thinks that ethical life, as a whole, has resources to cope with the macroeconomic problems ("the police") and anomie ("the Estates") that civil society engenders. If these prove to be mere stopgaps, then it would be fair to say that the contradictions of civil society constitute a crisis for the whole ethical order, but this does not appear to be Hegel's position.

Now, since Jaeggi can consider civil society a form of life in its own right, we can take the fact that it engenders serious problems that it itself cannot solve to be grounds for finding it in crisis. Yet, given the plethora of overlapping forms of life that Jaeggi countenances, it will often not be easy to determine whether some social problem is, in fact, posed by the form of life it afflicts. Take the opioid epidemic in the rural United States: certainly, the case can be made that it is symptomatic of some underlying contradiction in rural American life that is making it uninhabitable. But this is hardly the only the possibility: perhaps the contradiction is in, e.g., pharmaceutical capitalism and the rural form of life is just collateral damage; or perhaps there is no contradiction at all, and the epidemic is the unlucky product of exogenous factors (e.g., bad public policy) that small town America happens to be ill-equipped to absorb. Personally, I would decline to call this sort of issue a weakness in Jaeggi's theory, since it may just capture the way things are; it underscores the need for critique to combine theory, interpretation, and counterfactual analysis, while warning that critique in a complex, pluralistic society rarely yields clear, uncontroversial results. In any event, Jaeggi does provide a basis for holding that interpretive disputes about what is a contradiction, where it is located, etc., are themselves about something objective and rationally discernable.

A rich book like this one raises a host of other issues that deserve more development than fits between its covers, for example, how expansive and defensible its conception of progress is, and what the prospects are for saying that overarching formations like "capitalism" or "modernity" are forms of life. More generally, while Jaeggi never purports that a theory of forms of life is the entirety of a social theory, it is not entirely clear what kind of general theorization (if any) she would like to give to the linkages between forms of life and the state and legal institutions, and other social systems that operate "behind the back" of participants. While some stronger hints about how Jaeggi would like to handle such issues would have been welcome, her aims here are mostly methodological, and she is delving into some of these more substantive questions in work subsequent to this book's 2014 publication in the original German.[2] So, while it remains to be seen how fruitful Jaeggi's paradigm of critical theory will be when attempts are made to connect it to more concrete social theories and conceptions of the subject (and its emancipation), as it stands, the book quite brilliantly demonstrates the possibility of a critical theory austerely shorn of most essentialist elements, while nevertheless capable of engaging with a level of lived social reality closed off to other methods.

[1] See Jaeggi, "'No Individual Can Resist': Minima Moralia as Critique of Forms of Life," Constellations 12 (2005), pp. 65-81.

[2] On the former, see the essays and author reply collected in From Alienation to Forms of Life: The Critical Theory of Rahel Jaeggi, Amy Allen and Eduardo Mendieta (eds.), Penn State University Press, 2018; on the latter, see Nancy Fraser and Jaeggi, Capitalism: A Conversation in Critical Theory, Polity, 2018, especially pp. 13-60.