Critique of Practical Reason

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Immanuel Kant, Critique of Practical Reason, trans. Werner S. Pluhar, intro. Stephen Engstrom, Hackett Publishing Company, 2002, 352pp, $12.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-87220-617-3.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Kinlaw , McMurry University


This most welcome publication of Werner Pluhar’s translation of Kant’s Critique of Practical Reason completes his translation of the three main texts of Kant’s critical system. Pluhar is a veteran and highly accomplished translator whose work consistently has exhibited an equal mastery of German and English as well as the arguments of the texts he has translated. Those who have profited from his earlier translations of the First and (especially) Third Critiques will not be disappointed with this text. The translation is remarkably consistent, highly readable—in this respect, in this reviewer’s judgment, an advance on the Beck and Gregor translations (for the Gregor translation I refer to the recent 1997 Cambridge University Press edition)—and exceptionally well edited (I found only a single typographical error in the entire text: “instrutive” for “instructive” on page 52). Accompanying the text is a fine introduction (by Stephen Engstrom), an extensive glossary (ten pages), a twenty-seven-page bibliography, and an index (the final three not found in the Beck and Gregor editions).

Pluhar appears to view the task of the translator as follows: provide the reader with an as linguistically and philosophically accurate, smooth, and readable rendering as possible while keeping the reader, when advisable, close to the original German. In both respects, Pluhar succeeds admirably. Contributing in no small measure to this success is his consistent practice of providing justification for every controversial or difficult rendering of words and expressions, particularly when the translation departs from the Beck or (especially) Gregor editions. I found myself agreeing with Pluhar on almost every occasion, and some of his “corrections” of the Gregor translation are, in this reviewer’s judgment, important.

For instance, Gregor follows many translators in rendering Vermögen as “faculty” and thus Begehrungsvermögen as “faculty of desire.” Translations of other late eighteenth century texts often have followed this lead (e.g. Albert Blackwell in his highly regarded translation of Schleiermacher’s unpublished and unfinished treatise Über die Freiheit, Edwin Mellen Press, 1992). And yet, “faculty” is a highly misleading equivalent for Vermögen, and not simply because “faculty” intimates an association with faculty psychology. “Faculty” suggests an entity or mechanism that executes a given function, whereas Vermögen indicates a capacity, power, or ability. “Faculty” thus omits the focus on the activity of autonomous moral agency associated with the entire subject and thus fails to capture the pro-active nature of practical rationality wherein reason itself is the motivational force in human action. The later Fichte uses Vermögen similarly to express one’s power or ability to become an image of the divine and connects this with one’s general ability to be self-formative (he attempts to capture the immediacy of this power of self-formative activity with the term Sein-Können which he ties directly to Vermögen). With one exception (139) where “ability” is preferable (the alternative “power” is acknowledge in footnote), Pluhar uses “power” and thus renders Begehrungsvermögen as “power of desire.” Related to this translation of Vermögen is Pluhar’s choice of “power of choice” as the equivalent for Willkühr (Gregor uses “choice” exclusively) in contexts where there is a contrast with “power of desire” and thus Vermögen is implied. This reviewer judges these changes to be most welcome and overdue correctives.

The translation of these standard terms not only is more consistent with what Kant means but also brings the reader closer to the original text. Consider, similarly, a few additional examples. Gregor almost exclusively translates both Empfindung and Gefühl with the generic “feeling”, thereby in some instances obscuring, as Pluhar correctly indicates, subtle distinctions Kant intends to make. For instance, Kant sometimes maintains that pleasure informs practical reasoning only to the extent that one can sense—that is, with one or more senses—the gratification one will receive from a certain desirable object. If one renders Empfindung in these contexts as “feeling”, one does not capture with the same poignancy the sharp distinction between rational and non-rational determining grounds of the will. Though Kant often (and much more often than not) uses Empfindung and Gefühl interchangeably (as Pluhar notes), Pluhar’s decision to preserve for the reader Kant’s terminological distinctions when applicable is well advised and, as I have stressed, keeps the reader close to the precise meaning of the German original. Note also in this regard Pluhar’s translation of Bewegursache as “motivating cause”, as opposed to simply “motive”, in contexts in which Kant discusses causes.

Pluhar’s meticulous effort to justify or argue for controversial translations, renderings of opaque passages, and departures from previous translations makes for a highly annotated text in marked contrast to Gregor’s and Beck’s far more economic use of annotations and references. Add explanations of historical references (sometimes quite obscure and difficult to track down) in Kant’s text and Pluhar’s extensive cross-references to the First Critique, the Groundwork, and the Metaphysics of Morals—the first missing altogether in the Beck and Gregor editions and the other two used by them much more sparingly—and the footnotes accumulate quickly. In all, there are nine hundred eighty six footnote references to the translation. Some readers no doubt will find this excessive and a distraction, which, if not simply ignored, makes an otherwise reader-friendly translation cumbersome to work through. I think, however, that this assessment should be resisted. The payoff far exceeds any annoyance to the reader.

The extensive cross-references to other works of Kant provide a good study guide for those whose knowledge of Kant is less than that of a seasoned scholar. Identification of Latin roots for some Kantian terminology informs the reader when certain expressions have legal connections or connotations. Furthermore, supplying the German original for certain terms and expressions offers a reader with some command of German a guideline for deciding when it might be necessary to refer back to the original German text and the context in which the term or expression appeared. Those returning to the German text along with the translation are also aided by Pluhar’s occasional clarification of obscure pronoun antecedents, especially when a proper English rendering requires some departure from the German (as noted, in all instances Pluhar argues thoroughly for these departures). In sum, this reviewer does not find the use of footnote references over-indulgent; on the contrary, they contribute to the overall effective study of the text.

As noted above, Stephen Engstrom’s introduction accompanies the translation. Since the publisher has an admirable tradition of marketing relatively inexpensive editions of philosophical classics for classroom and general use, the introduction is an important component of the overall success of the book. Engstrom’s introduction is very clearly presented and readable—his examples, in my judgment, consistently helpful—especially for the undergraduate who has some grasp of modern philosophy and thus some familiarity with Kant. As expected, Engstrom attempts to set the Critique of Practical Reason in the context of Kant’s moral theory (that is, its relation both to the Groundwork and the Metaphysics of Morals) and of the critique of metaphysics carried out in the First Critique. Engstrom attempts to initiate the reader by means of a distinct point of entry into the text, one that becomes an organizational theme for his introduction and one that contrasts with Andrews Reath’s introduction to the Gregor translation. This reviewer does not judge Engstrom’s introduction as significantly superior or inferior to Reath’s, but the orientation and emphases are clearly different. If one relies upon introductions to texts for classroom use, one should be aware of the Engstrom’s and Reath’s contrasting approaches to the Second Critique.

Suppose one teaches an advanced undergraduate course on Kant’s ethics or, better, a course on practical rationality and freedom in which one chooses to devote a unit to the Kantian position. In these cases, I recommend the Reath introduction over Engstrom’s for the simple reason that Reath concentrates on Kant’s theory of rational agency as the organizing principle for introducing Kant’s moral theory. His background discussion of Kritik is accordingly set in the context of Kant’s attempt to establish the basic principles of practical rationality. As a result, there are closer inspections than the reader receives from Engstrom of Theorems I-III and of the way in which Kant explains how reason can be a genuine motivational force in human decision and action.

Engstrom’s introduction attempts to situate the Second Critique in the broader scope of Kant’s critique of traditional metaphysics and his attempt to reconstitute a foundation for metaphysics. This theme is evident early in the introduction as Engstrom places Kant’s central question—can reason determine the will directly?—in the context of whether reason of itself can be a source of practical knowledge. As such, Engstrom’s piece has, in my judgment, a wider appeal, not only an as orientation to Kant’s theory of practical rationality and the foundation for morality, but also to the role of the Second Critique in Kant’s work as a systematic philosopher. To this end, Engstrom provides a more comprehensive assessment of the First Critique background than does Reath, and notably gives far more attention to the historical sources of Kant’s moral theory and the historical debates between rationalists and sentimentalists Kant attempts to resolve (Reath, for instance, ignores Leibnizian perfectionism presumably because that moral theory was seen by Kant to have an impoverished moral psychology and thus to offer little that might inform a theory of agency). The attention to historical background, concisely and effectively summarized by Engstrom, is a helpful aid to the less initiated reader and, in this reviewer’s judgment, important. An additional asset is that the student can more readily discern that Kant is attempting to overcome two forms of reductionism (rationalism and sentimentalism) along with two forms of skepticism about the rational foundation for morality (skepticism about rationalism being associated with standard suspicion about moral perfectionism and its theistic underpinning). Engstrom captures these themes quite well. Finally, Engstrom’s approach results in a more comprehensive presentation of the role of the ideas of reason in Kant’s moral theory and critical philosophy.

In sum, this reviewer highly recommends this translation. Its achievement can be placed easily alongside Pluhar’s earlier very successful Kant translations. The bibliography, essential for classroom use, is well edited, and the glossary provides a concise introduction to a translator’s general approach to the text. I find Engstrom’s introduction to be a thorough and effective balance of history and analysis, in short, a fine piece of work. Those, particularly scholars of Kant’s ethics, more interested in practical rationality and moral psychology likely will prefer the Reath introduction. Engstrom’s piece, on the other hand, is preferable for a wider undergraduate audience.