Cultivating Virtue: Perspectives from Philosophy, Theology, and Psychology

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Nancy E. Snow (ed.), Cultivating Virtue: Perspectives from Philosophy, Theology, and Psychology, Oxford University Press, 2015, 349pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199967445.

Reviewed by Erica Lucast Stonestreet, College of St. Benedict and St. John's University


The motivation for this volume is to call attention to the development and cultivation of virtue, and to stimulate further work on this relatively neglected aspect of virtue ethics. To this end, Nancy Snow has collected work from philosophical, theological, and psychological angles, representing some non-Western as well as major Western traditions. The result is a set of essays that gives a sense of historical and current understandings of virtue development, raises worthwhile questions, and points out directions for future research. Some of the pieces should prove extremely important in these respects. Three of the most important themes that emerge are probably (1) the importance of early upbringing for the future development of virtue, (2) the central place of action in learning virtue, and (3) the indispensability of community for both cultivating and maintaining virtue, which is an ongoing activity.

Many of the essays have large expository components, but the significance of the exposition varies. A few seem mainly to be rescuing an important figure from a bad reputation: Julia Driver aims to show how Mill was centrally concerned with virtue despite the reputation of consequentialism as entirely about action; Adam Cureton and Thomas Hill point out how standard understandings of Kant overlook the rich account of virtue he actually had.

While these accounts are interesting in their own right and also because they indirectly recognize virtue as an important aspect of morality, they are less interesting than others in the volume that connect exposition to broader implications. Elizabeth Bucar's account of how Ibn Miskawayh's understanding of virtue illuminates the Muslim practice of veiling goes a long way toward better understanding modern debates about that practice, as well as making more general points about how virtue can be cultivated. Owen Flanagan's description of Buddhist ethics and metaphysics suggests how these are intertwined, which in turn suggests the general point that people can become motivated toward virtue if they cultivate a world view that connects them with the world in particular ways. Jennifer Herdt's account of Christian practices designed to shape character shows a view of virtue as deeply embodied, practical, and communal, despite the church's historical objections to the concept. Edward Slingerland's argument that the Confucian view of moral development provides a strong rebuttal to the situationist critique of virtue ethics is convincing.

Not all the essays are so expository, and I will organize the rest of my review around the themes identified above. Many pieces discuss the importance of early childhood for the later development of virtue, but the three that contribute most to this theme are Michael Slote's, Darcia Narvaez's, and Ross Thompson's. Slote begins by observing that discussions of moral development and methods of teaching children to be moral tend to assume that the children have been loved, with (usually tacit) acknowledgment that children who aren't loved may not respond to the methods in question. He points out that unloved children often have psychopathic tendencies, and if this is the result of their being unloved, then love in very early childhood is a condition for moral development. The question is why: how does love lay this foundation for later moral development?

Slote traces the following route from early love to moral development. When we are loved, we "empathically 'take in'" our parents' love, which amounts to taking in "the sympathetic attitude or motive that is focused in our direction" (74). Our empathy with our caregivers' sympathy causes us to feel sympathy. This is essentially what gratitude amounts to, Slote argues: our empathically gained sympathy is directed primarily toward its immediate cause, and we wish to reciprocate to our benefactor the good done to us -- that is, we are grateful. The key to moral development, then, is that this sympathy can spill over onto others (the way anger at a specific target can spill into anger at others). Receiving love in our earliest years thus exercises our inborn capacities for empathy that form the basis of morality later in life. Good moral education will make use of both empathy and sympathy, for instance by asking a child to imagine how a victim of hitting must feel about being hit, which aims to motivate making reparations and refraining from future hitting.

Slote's argument is yet another reason to understand love as an indispensable moral attitude, which to my mind is an important contribution. His essay also helps to show just how deep the roots of care ethics may go. But the piece could benefit from deeper engagement with psychological literature; fortunately, this volume contains two pieces by psychologists that fit very nicely with Slote's themes.

Narvaez's contribution has a lot of resonance with the others. She indirectly provides scientific backing for Slote's claim that being loved in early childhood is essential to later moral development, though her account ranges beyond the parent-child relationship that Slote concentrates on. Narvaez approaches moral development by looking at what kinds of development humans evolved to need, identifying elements of the "evolved developmental niche" (EDN), most of which center around responsive parenting -- love. Children who grow up in environments with these particular manifestations of love thrive in the sense of being physically and socially healthy, empathic, emotionally intelligent, engaged with others and the world, and communally oriented. Children who lack elements of the EDN display detachment, an individualistic, self-protective "safety" orientation, and lives in which fear and anger are prominent motivators.

Narvaez frequently contrasts modern Western upbringings with those of indigenous peoples, holding up the latter as examples of societies in which children are raised in the EDN and indicting modern societies for their detachment from that EDN, with resulting moral, social, and environmental degradation. The piece raises many questions about how to use the knowledge Narvaez presents and to reconcile it with other values and goods that have come out of modern civilization. She is implicitly deriving an "ought" from an "is," though perhaps this isn't all bad -- just as knowing what it takes for a plant to flourish requires knowing its nature, knowing what it takes for humans to flourish requires knowledge of our nature. I am sympathetic to her project, but visions of the good life for humans are contested, and there are a host of issues in this vicinity. To take up any implicit recommendations, we will need the EDN described in more detail to understand whether modern life necessarily precludes the kind of nurture that humans need, or whether our drift away from it is only a contingent historical development -- tasks I understand Narvaez to undertake in other work. The primary focus in this short piece is to make the case that virtue develops implicitly and deeply given the right conditions. Her evidence about virtue development could easily be seen to support the ideas and recommendations of most of the other essays and might do quite a bit of good if it were publicized widely and taken seriously in both private and public life.

Thompson presents studies on childhood premoral sensibilities to argue that early childhood development is important to the cultivation of virtue, in the sense that (at the very least) "complex competencies at any age emerge from earlier skills that are progenitors to those that come later" (298). His piece thus complements Narvaez's in that he fills in some details, and it supports Slote's piece in particular, and the rest of them more generally.

Thompson presents work that shows that children as young as 18 months can display shared intentionality, that two-to-three year olds display behavior associated with conscience, and that children are developing a moral sense of themselves before age 5. The research he presents on conscience and moral self emphasizes the role parents play in eliciting and shaping these tendencies, thus reinforcing what Narvaez and Slote claim about the power of love in early childhood to serve as a foundation for later moral development. Thompson points out that none of the tendencies and capabilities discovered in early childhood amount to full-blown virtue, but he highlights the factors that influence their development, thus implicitly indicating what can go wrong. He notes that the research here is limited and leaves us with many open questions, but that what we do know offers clear direction for further study. He also explains why our impressions of young children as egocentric have a foundation: while they have these nascent sensitivities to the feelings, needs and intentions of others, their poor executive function, inability to help effectively, and easy distractibility can probably account for the appearance of ego-centeredness. Without actually making policy recommendations, he points out that all of this research has enormous implications for how we should help those who do not grow up in the environments conducive to the development of these early, premoral sensitivities.

The book's second major theme highlights the role of action in learning virtue. I'll begin with Christine Swanton's piece. Swanton proposes that we look carefully at a virtue of moral self-improvement, given that virtue ethics enjoins us to live lives of virtue (i.e. take virtuous action), which requires learning to be virtuous and then maintaining that state. Studying the virtue of moral self-improvement, she claims, promises to resolve two problems that have plagued virtue ethics: the self-centeredness problem, and the problem of how to account for the rightness of acts by learners that actual virtuous people would never perform.

I may be misunderstanding her, but it looks to me as though Swanton gives an effective response to these problems without needing to appeal to a further virtue of self-improvement. Her solution comes from the persuasive suggestion that what the agent aims at is leading a virtuous life, not cultivating virtue. That would mean that the paradigm of right action is not whatever a virtuous person would do, as many eudaimonist models suggest. Rather, the aim is to hit the targets of virtues, and although she may not be fully virtuous in doing so because she fails to get the right attitude, right time, right amount, etc., her actions are not self-centered, nor is there any problem praising her for hitting the target even if she doesn't achieve full virtue. This solution seems to be enough; it highlights the importance of doing virtuous actions as the first step toward virtue, with the hope that (through feedback and reflection) the other things required for full virtue will follow. Adding a separate virtue thus seems like an epicycle, a philosopher's answer to a philosopher's problem.

Furthermore, the virtue flirts with self-centeredness, given that "One important good to be attained" by the virtue of moral self-improvement "is that of improving an agent's own virtue" (121). If we aim at improving ourselves, how will this result in any actual improvement, if what we need to do is stop thinking about ourselves? The idea that virtues aim at a target is supposed to counteract this; what we do in trying to act virtuously is hit that target, not think about ourselves. If that's right (and I think it is), then we must understand the target of self-improvement to be hitting the targets of other virtues, lest we risk self-centeredness. This might work, but it seems self-effacing, which Swanton thinks is a problem with the eudaimonist's solution to self-centeredness.

Several other essays touch on the theme of action as the first step toward virtue. Bucar uses the conception of virtue in Islamic thinker Ibn Miskawayh's work to illuminate how the physical practice of veiling helps cultivate a virtue of modesty in both women and men. Daniel Russell highlights the parallels between virtue and skill in Aristotle to show how practicing virtuous action (and then reflecting on feedback) helps to develop virtue, thus assimilating virtue to many other domains of psychology that we know a great deal about, and revealing directions for further study. Dan McAdams's piece highlights (among other things) the way "social action precedes motivated intention" (312) -- that is, habits developed from social pressures come to be guided by practical reason -- to show that virtue can develop from less sophisticated motivations for action.

The third theme, community's role in cultivating and maintaining virtue, runs through many essays, particularly Narvaez's and Flanagan's, but is strongest in Herdt and Bucar. Herdt shows how physical, communal Christian rituals have been used to shape character in an ongoing way and in light of human frailty. She argues that repeated exposure to Christian ritual and practice may help build stable character traits and create common subjective meaning for disparate objective circumstances. Having a community to answer to helps us reflect on and improve our own behaviors. It also helps us to control circumstances in ways that are conducive to virtue.

Bucar, in addition to making important points about the physical practice of virtue, draws our attention to the social nature of the Islamic conception of virtue in Ibn Miskawayh's thought. This has four aspects. First, becoming virtuous requires the support of others. Second, because the interpersonal sphere is where most of our actions take place, we need interactions with others in order to put virtue into action and make it actual rather than potential. Third, observing others' success and failure helps us to reflect on our own virtue and become better. Fourth, individual virtue cultivation allows us to form virtuous societies.

A fourth theme may emerge in Slingerland's essay: shaping and controlling the environment should be understood as part of cultivating virtue. (Once identified, it is possible to see this theme in several places, particularly in the theological pieces.) Slingerland's primary purpose is to use the Confucian model of moral development to respond to situationist critiques of virtue ethics, but what we can take from his essay goes well beyond this. He begins with a survey of the current state of psychological work on personality traits, pointing out some empirical and conceptual flaws in the situationists' use of the empirical research. These alone are a striking rebuttal to the situationist claim. Nevertheless, Slingerland says, virtue ethics tends to suggest that a truly virtuous person will have an extremely high degree of consistency in their virtuous behavior -- much more than the empirical evidence suggests we can achieve. He uses the Confucian model of virtue cultivation to suggest that this level of virtue can indeed be achieved, and that as a theory, virtue ethics may be more psychologically realistic than consequentialism or deontology.

Slingerland suggests that the Confucian strategy is two-pronged: structured training incorporating study, action and reflection gives the Confucian learner a better metaphorical jump, while careful awareness and control of the physical, conceptual, and social environment lowers the virtue bar to a height that gives her a better chance of clearing it. The picture that results paints cultivating virtue as a slow and ongoing process that is heavily dependent on interaction with others as well as on mindfulness about oneself. (There is resonance here with Herdt's account of virtue in Christianity.) I find this piece not only illuminating, but also strong in its ability to suggest concrete strategies we can take to develop virtue, as well as indicating areas for further research.

Through all of this, we can see how learning virtue involves performing actions, taking the perspective of others, and eventually, shaping attitudes. This requires reflecting on the strengths and weaknesses of our performances (an activity often done with others), and though this point is never made explicitly enough to rise to the level of a theme, reflection -- as part of the learning process -- underwrites the development of virtue in all of the pieces, including the psychologists'.

As a whole, the book doesn't hang together in a thematically satisfying way. It could have benefited from a more unifying central question or perhaps from the authors' having access to one another's contributions before finalizing their pieces; this might have enhanced inter-essay points of contact. It might also have benefited from a methodological piece, a discussion of how thinkers in different fields can and should respond to and incorporate one another's work. How should we develop our philosophical and theological accounts of virtue in light of current research? How can philosophy and theology, in turn, suggest interpretations of current psychological research and directions for future empirical research? There is some such discussion here and there, but I found myself wishing for more; for instance, the thematic connections between Slote's, Narvaez's and Thompson's pieces are strong but undeveloped. Perhaps the lesson to take away is that we are merely at the beginning of understanding how virtue develops and how it can be cultivated, and as psychology continues to recover from its situationist days, we still have a great deal to learn despite a long history of philosophical reflection on the subject. Interdisciplinary dialogue would no doubt enhance the conversation.

I have not been able to point out everything worth discussing in this collection. Some of the pieces are written extremely well and deserve wide circulation. Those by Narvaez, Slingerland, Slote, Flanagan, Thompson, Bucar, and Russell are highlights. But there is something worth reading in each piece, and the volume as a whole promises to achieve its goal of stimulating further work on virtue development.


I would like to thank my colleague Charles Wright for valuable conversation about the essays and his comments on a draft of this review.