Cultural Appropriation and the Arts

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James O. Young, Cultural Appropriation and the Arts, Blackwell Publishing, 2008, 168pp., $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405176569.

Reviewed by John Rapko, San Francisco Art Institute


In Cultural Appropriation and the Arts, James O. Young aims to investigate "the ethical and aesthetic issues that arise when appropriation occurs in the context of the arts." Young views the philosophical clarification of these issues as a two-step process. First, he gives definitions of the key concepts of "appropriation" and "arts," and delimits his investigation as one concerned with "cultural" appropriation. Second, he determines the relevant issues as "aesthetic" and "moral," and then discusses the most prominent arguments that surround each type of appropriation. The outcome of the investigation, Young claims, is that most of the prima facie problematic character of cultural appropriation dissolves under scrutiny. There is little left for the philosopher to say other than to urge, with Picasso, artists to steal, and to recommend respect as the attitude appropriate to appropriators.

Of the many marks and characterizations of conceptions of culture, Young focuses on the insider/outsider relation. Culture is something both shared by and constitutive of groups. With the qualifications that an individual may be bi- or multi-cultural, and that groups may overlap and have fuzzy edges, cultures involve subsets of humanity. 'Cultural' appropriation occurs when one culture or some member of that culture takes and uses some materials (in a loose sense) from another culture. By virtue of the first culture’s use of the materials, it claims some propriety relation to the materials (at least in their second use), as the owner of such materials, or as the maker or author of the artifacts in which the materials figure. Young is concerned with such appropriation in the arts, which he treats as a concept unproblematic in its extension in modern life. Young identifies three sorts of appropriation: of an object; of some 'content', which can be, in order of decreasing richness, an idea, a style, or a motif; and of a subject or 'voice', wherein some outsider presents the lives and sensibilities of some insiders of an alien culture. An example of object appropriation is the British government's appropriation of the Greek Elgin marbles. Within the general category of content appropriation, Young treats an idea as something well articulated, as in Kurosawa's appropriation of Shakespeare's plots. By 'style' Young seems to mean distinctive patterning of sensuous elements that are identifiable at a glance. A motif is some fragment of an artwork that is identifiable in abstraction from its use in any particular work. Picasso's rendering of some of the prostitutes' heads in "Les Demoiselles d'Avignon" in a style reminiscent of carved African masks is an instance of this sub-category. A paradigmatic instance of subject or voice appropriation is "when outsiders represent the lives of insiders in the first person."

Within this area of concern, Young thinks that two very general sorts of objections arise. The first sort he calls aesthetic objections. An objection is aesthetic if the critic claims that, insofar as a work exhibits cultural appropriation, it is worse as art. Such objections involve "pure aesthetics," that is, aesthetic concerns and values considered in abstraction from their moral dimensions. The most important aesthetic objections are grouped under the 'aesthetic handicap thesis', the general claim "that all artists, regardless of their abilities, face insurmountable obstacles when they engage in cultural appropriation." The most focused versions of such objections turn on the question of authenticity, or rather, the purportedly inevitably inauthentic results of cultural appropriation. Since appropriation has been delimited as an activity of outsiders on a culture (necessarily of insiders), the aesthetic handicap thesis is specified as the claim that the outsider's appropriation is inevitably aesthetically unsuccessful because inauthentic. The test of this claim, Young thinks, is whether experts can reliably distinguish insider and outsider products, and/or whether they invariably judge outsiders' products inferior to (the best of?) insiders' works. Young then can readily cite experts, such as African-American blues musicians, who judge the works of, say, the British blues-rock guitarist Eric Clapton successful. There are two senses, Young thinks, of the term "authenticity" that arise in (pure) aesthetic criticism, where the issue is whether authenticity is an aesthetic property (p. 47). One sense is that of personal authenticity -- whether the work is "the product of an artist's individual genius." Since works, or aspects of works, need not be innovative in order to count as an individual's expression, there is no reason to think that culturally appropriated material will necessarily be inauthentic. A second sense is "existential authenticity" (p. 50), which is marked by the characteristic that the artist is fully committed to everything done in the making of the artwork, and which comes to expression in it. Young is (rightly) skeptical that existential authenticity is even an aesthetic value, and in any case it is difficult to see purportedly existential inauthenticity in artworks involving cultural appropriation as any more problematic than an atheist singing an aria from a Bach cantata. Finally, there is style authenticity, when a work possesses a certain style exhibited by a canon of successful artworks, and that work’s style initially seems discontinuous with that canon. Young discusses this using as his example the early music movement. This suggests his thought must be that there is a relevant analogy between the temporal and stylistic breaks between baroque music and twentieth-century performances on the one hand, and the cultural barrier between insiders and outsiders on the other. But again Young defuses the objection by citing widely considered aesthetic successes of later works. Young ends with discussion of aesthetic objections to subject appropriation, where the work of an outsider represents (or misrepresents) the sensibility of lives of some insiders. Young unsurprisingly rejects the charge with the counterclaim that there are successful works of outsiders, such as Faulkner's Light in August, which do not misrepresent the lives of insiders. He suggests, quoting Stanley Cavell, that the aesthetic objection to cultural appropriation of subjects turns on whether the insider is viewed as merely instantiating some role, or better as projecting a way of inhabiting some role.

Young then turns to the second stage of his process, (taking more than half of the book) and considers various moral objections to cultural appropriation. Earlier (p. 22) he stated that his concern throughout the book would be with moral issues, as opposed to legal issues, and that though the two share concern with wrongs, they can be initially distinguished since legal wrongs vary from culture to culture, and moral issues are "universal." In the third chapter Young surprisingly considers at length the issue of cultural appropriation as theft -- surprising, since he had earlier stated that the sense of cultural appropriation he is concerned with is artistic appropriation, that is, the use by an outside artist of insider's elements. The few instances related to this that he does consider include works by Elaine Sturtevant, who creates 'original' works that are visually indiscernible from works by other well known artists, and by Sherrie Levine, who has presented as original works her photographs of other photographers' works. But the various types of appropriation practiced by these artists do not to my knowledge cross cultural boundaries. Much of the chapter consists in discussion of the question whether a culture as a whole can be said to own artifacts produced (in the past or the present) by its insiders, working either as individuals or in groups. Young concludes that only some particular artifacts ought to be collectively owned, and that judgments of ownership should be rightly guided by two moral intuitions: that respect for testamentary wishes lies at the core of inheritance (and so legitimate ownership); and that the intuition enshrined in modern copyright law that a balance ought to be struck between artists’ interest in owning their products and the interests of everyone in access to and free discussion of those products.

In the remaining two chapters Young discusses what he takes to be the two major moral objections to cultural appropriation: that it harms the culture and/or its members (chapter 4), and that it profoundly offends the culture and/or its members (chapter 5). The division of wrongs into harms and profound offenses seems drawn from Joel Feinberg's classic studies. The attribution of harm, according to Feinberg, presupposes that people are viewed as having interest and rights, and it is to be explicated in light of the way it thwarts interest and/or violates rights. Offense, by contrast, is directed at people's sense of their comprehensive identity, not merely their individual identities considered in abstraction from their collective identifications. Offense in the relevant sense is always at least partly impersonal, and one can be offended at the very idea of something, not just in one's confrontation with an actual instance of it. Against a criticism arising from a variety of ways cultural appropriation might harm (individuals in) cultures, Feinberg cites the example of a white jazz musician like Bix Beiderbecke who might be thought to harm a culture by 'stealing' its indigenous content and thereby diverting attention and recognition away from the originary culture, Young counters (p. 112) that there is no reason to think that cultural appropriation as such (whether in relatively successful or unsuccessful works) harms the original culture. Rather, "we should always be reluctant to say that a person acts wrongly who is engaged in an act of self-realization" (p. 113). Young invokes the concept of an artistic commons to claim that no individual or culture can rightly claim to monopolize the presentation of contents or subjects for any audiences. Finally, Young considers cases where cultural appropriation might be thought to cause 'profound', that is, deep and serious, offense. Granting that "profound offensiveness is not a prima facie reason for thinking it wrong," Young thinks that there are usually countervailing reasons that profoundly offensive art is valuable: as inquiry, and again as part of self-realization. Even in cases where insiders are reasonably offended by outsiders' representations of the insiders in stereotypically derogatory ways, the interest in outsiders' self-realization is overriding. The only legitimate restrictions on profoundly offensive cultural appropriation, Young thinks, relate to inappropriate times and places, as with a case where it would be wrong, say, to show in a religious context a painting desecrating that religion's symbols.

The upshot of Young's succession of counter-arguments to the most prominent criticisms of cultural appropriation is that few instances of cultural appropriation are wrong, whether 'aesthetically' or 'morally'. So Young, like Collingwood, counsels artists to do what they've always done: to appropriate (i.e. steal) as their expressive needs in the service of self-realization demand. The only qualification seems more a point of etiquette than morality: one ought to do so with "respect and politeness." The gentleman thief?

The chief virtues of the book, I think, are the conceptual clarifications Young brings to this diffuse topic, in particular the basic distinctions among types of appropriation. The distinctions can serve as the basis of piecemeal discussions of the different objections. But there is a nagging sense that Young has made the discussion too simple by virtue of this very clarity of focus. The restriction to cultural appropriation in the arts (in the 'modern' sense) permits Young to invoke in train the concepts of an artistic commons and self-realization. The judge, observing as it were from some third position outside both the insider's culture and the outsider's appropriation, will regularly find that the interest in the outsider's appropriation and the judge's interest in access to it to outweigh the insider's interest. One way of putting the worry is that some sense of what it's like to be an insider is missing. That the attempt to do this would be an instance of subject appropriation might add an intensified self-reflection to the account. A second worry, connected to this first, is Young's basic conceptualization of persons as bearers of interests (especially, again, in self-realization) and rights, and as possessing a universalistic moral sensibility and particularistic legal sensibility and culture. A great deal of discussion in recent decades on questions of the existence and character of irreducibly social goods and 'thick' ethical concerns suggests that such questions are not as easily framed as questions about (thin) moral concerns or (positive) legal issues.

Finally, a very different concern: perhaps the liberal framework of self-realizations, interests and rights, artistic commons, etc., is unavoidable in the present. Might this not in part be attributable to the new globalization of cultural forms of Western modernity? On this account the insider/outsider distinction has little purchase in actual social life. A philosophical account that begins from such a conception would presuppose ways of life long since grown old. Here the owl of Minerva flies after midnight.