Cultural Evolution: Conceptual Challenges

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Tim Lewens, Cultural Evolution: Conceptual Challenges, Oxford University Press, 2015, 205pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199674183.


Reviewed by Lenny Moss, University of Exeter


This is an unusual, one might even say peculiar, book. Contrary to what one might expect from the bold parsimony of its title, Tim Lewens is not presenting a first-order exposition on cultural evolution as such but rather something of a second-order intervention into debates about recent work in cultural evolution. As more of a mediator or referee than an expositor offering a critical entrée to the uninitiated, his sense of accountability is more about being judicious on the micro-level than that of setting out a critical contextualization of 'cultural evolutionary theory' on the macro-level. "Cultural evolution" can, and has, meant many different things to many different people. Lewens' specification of cultural evolution tends to be emergently performed through his choice of debates (and debaters), which is also to say that there is something that remains elusive about his larger concept of cultural evolution. Lewens may well anticipate just such a challenge in claiming (pp 100-102) that the sense of cultural evolution that he is (albeit with reservations) defending is meant to be understood only as a research program and not a philosophy of nature, but surely any philosophical intervention in the name of cultural evolution cannot justifiably immunize itself against accountability for its wider implications. The present review will endeavor to bring the details of Lewens' treatment to light in just such a wider context.

Contrasts are good for conceptual clarity and the sharper the contrast the better for clarity. Our ability to specify what Lewens intends by cultural evolution will benefit from setting forth what it is not. Modern interests in weaving back together what subsequently came to be referred to as the biological and the cultural realms have roots in Enlightenment thought. Herder in particular launched an entire framework for studying language and folk-practices, i.e., cultural evolution, on the idea that the loss of adaptive physiological specialization of humans constituted a radical break, and a radical transition, in the continuity of nature. This rupture resulted in making a hitherto unprecedented depth and breadth of sociality amongst primates both absolutely necessary and for the first time possible by releasing humans from obligate response patterns (i.e., instincts) to particular frequencies of natural stimuli which are the hallmarks of adaptive physiological specialization. Herder referred to this new seminal capacity to direct one's attention as "besonnenheit". As a necessary compensation for natural detachment from physiological specialization, humans are effectively bound together not contingently by individual prerogatives but constitutively for their very existence as humans. As compensation for the loss of fixed adaptive specialization, the human (or really "hominin") group emerges as a new unit of nature,[1] one which constitutes its manner of survival through shared, contingent, malleable but normatively regulated and integrated practices we now call culture. Two related features, relevant to subsequent discussion, of what could be called an expressive-constitutive understanding of what it means to be a socio-cultural creature, is that we are inevitably, and uniquely, self-interpreting animals who draw our interpretive resources from within our socio-cultural sphere, and that we not only feel accountable to the norms of our socio-cultural world but can also refer to them as shared commitments that can be appealed to.

We can now begin a survey of Lewens' book using the above as a contrasting backdrop. The title of the first chapter is "What is Cultural Evolutionary Theory?" but in lieu of a presentation about what cultural evolutionary theory (CET) could and/or should mean we are quickly ushered into a tripartite taxonomy of approaches to CET which Lewens' performatively implies is exhaustive; these are the historical, the selectionist and the kinetic approaches. We can then draw a very basic distinction between the historical approach on the one hand, and the selectionist and kinetic approaches on the other, all in relationship to Darwin. Where the historical approach is characteristic of how Darwin actually spoke about cultural and non-biological change more generally, the selectionist and kinetic approaches are attempts to model explanations of cultural change on the Darwinian biological model (as he didn't do). Our possibility space for understanding cultural evolution, it seems, is limited to either approaching it as Darwin had done, or as a Darwinist who has taken Darwinism beyond Darwin.

The peculiarities of Lewens' "Cultural Evolution" can begin to be interpretable when we realize that for Lewens a cultural evolutionary theorist is an evolutionary biologist interested in an expanded treatment of human evolution that brings culture more fully into the ambit of its theory and that the job of the philosopher, or more specifically the Darwinian philosopher, is to fine tune the fine points and defend some manner of the enterprise against the challenges of the sceptics.

Selectionists and proponents of the Kinetic Theory then are those evolutionary biologists that share the belief that an adequate account of human evolution must include more than just genes as the medium of evolutionarily relevant transmission between generations. For a Selectionist the strategy is that of substituting cultural units of transmission into an otherwise ostensibly traditional Modern Synthesis model of evolution by natural selection. For this to work then minimally one must be able to identify units of culture that compete with each other for survival. Lewens' interest however is in leading us to the less demanding Kinetic Theory. Following Peter J. Richerson and Robert Boyd,[2] the Kinetic Theory relaxes the need for a selectionist mechanism but retains the population level approach to explaining cultural phenomena, i.e., it "asks us so explain cultural phenomena in terms of the aggregated effects of small-scale events; in this case, instances of learning" (p17). Lewens then motivates the use of the appellation Kinetic Theory that he has chosen as follows:

The approach is shared by the kinetic theory of gases, which also tells us that phenomena such as pressure and temperature are the outcomes of many summed interactions of smaller elements within a volume of gas, and that by adding up these interactions in statistically sophisticated ways we can understand the behavior of the aggregate (p17).

Chapter two, which is meant to further articulate the Kinetic Theory, concludes with reference to three challenges that the Kinetic Theory must face:

These include the propriety of the explicitly informational manner in which culture is understood by kinetic theorists, the risks of using mathematical models that draw on highly abstract characterizations of cognition, and the limitations of approaches that see cultural trends solely as the outcome of aggregated interactions between individuals (p 43).

Why model culture on the properties of an ideal gas and what are the consequences of doing so? Even the simplest living system is not gas but aqueous-based soft condensed matter structured by very complex dynamic arrays of strong and weak bonds. The principal idealization of a kinetic model of gases is that there are no attractive or repulsive forces between the individual particles. Interactions are purely mechanical and entirely transient. There can be no place in a "kinetic theory" for the idea, suggested above, that the very possibility for culture is predicated upon a radical transition to a new form of intersubjectivity, i.e., a change in the bonding forces between individuals, which is likely to be why there is not so much as a single mention of two of our leading contemporary theorists of the origins of culture; cognitive psychologists Merlin Donald and Michael Tomasello. For Donald the cognitive basis of culture is about the constitutive interaction between individual brains and "cognitive communities". Can we meaningfully theorize about cultural evolution without inquiring into its enabling socio-cognitive infrastructure? Much of Donald's work has consisted of fleshing out the details of the evolution of culture in terms of three transitions in the socio-cognitive infrastructure that have hypothetically taken place over the past one and half millions years.[3]

Along complementary lines Tomasello has set forth a strong empirical as well as theoretical case for culture being predicated upon the evolutionary emergence of joint and collective intentionality, also known as "we-mode".[4] Despite all the considerable philosophical attention it has received, there simply is no place for "we-mode" in Lewens' account given the atomistic commitments of the Kinetic Model. A third contemporary theorist, Sarah Hrdy, is mentioned but only once in the final chapter and with respect to a very localized discussion. What is never considered is whether her positing of a radical social transition during the Pleistocene that she refers to as the onset of "emotional modernity" could well have been part and parcel of a revolution in the cognitive and affective fabric of hominin sociality that constituted the natural conditions of possibility for subsequent cultural evolution.[5] What is condemnable in Lewens' account is not that he could be mistaken about whether radical, social-fabric level, transition(s) took place, but that the very topic of the conditions of possibility for cultural evolution is denied any place in his account of cultural evolution.

This bias and this discrepancy is further magnified in Lewens' subsequent (chapters 4 and 5) discussion of human nature. The crux of this discussion is structured by Lewens' mediation of the differences between the views of three chosen interlocutors: Edouard Machery, Richard Samuels, and Grant Ramsey, who all seem to agree that whatever is relevant to being human can be analyzed into discrete "traits" or characteristics, none of which are likely to be present in all humans. The arguments then pertain to what the best criteria should be, statistical commonality?, origins in natural selection?, presence in a life-history trait cluster?, for anointing as bona fide pieces of human nature. But does the scope of this conversation elicit the best philosophical and empirical resources at our disposal or does it reflect more of a localized, internecine skirmish? Asking questions about human nature, from the point of view of CET, as Lewens sees it, appears to involve looking through a fairly narrowly focused lens that distances what one sees from that which enables us to recognize each other as human in an everyday unproblematic way. Surely, we really are creatures who engage in joint intentionality, who are uniquely sensitive to the judgements of our ubiquitous generalized others, whose personhood from the get-go is intersubjectively, developmentally constituted and perennially involved in joint attentions, emotions, identities and goals, are self-interpreting beings who are also uniquely sensitive to inferences (and accountabilities) present in both our symbolic and pre-symbolic forms of communication. Even if, for whatever reason, one were to condone the exclusion of the best insights on offer from phenomenology, philosophical anthropology and hermeneutics, ignoring the work of contemporary empirical scientists of the caliber of Donald, Tomasello and Hrdy should surely raise worries about needless and unhelpful de facto sectarianism and an arbitrarily circumscribed conversation.

It is fair enough to suggest that any theory will have deficits that need to be weighed against its benefits and that the jury is still out on what bounties of insight aggregative mathematical models may yet produce. Lewens himself is at his best when it comes to mitigating putatively categorical differences between genetic and socially constructed 'information' as he demonstrates in his concluding chapter on emotion. At least as yet, however, Lewens has had nothing to say about cultural evolution in music, art, literature, drama, dance, cinema, sports, law, morality, religion, architecture, design, culinary practice, fashion, education, child-rearing, play, forms of celebration, body art, forms of political expression, work, leisure, transportation, travel, changes in social norms with respect to gender, race, sexual preference, ethnic identity, styles of friendship, of love, mutual aid, of reproductive relationships, in philosophy or in science but quite a bit to say, and in many places, about the evolution of extended lactose tolerance (pp 3, 63, 81, 89-93, 101, 150, 190) (which presumably accounts for the dust-jacket cover reproduction of Anton Mauve's nineteenth century portrait of a farmer and four dairy cows).

The benefits and deficits of a work concerned with human nature and/or at least the nature of human cultural change is inevitably not only epistemic but also normative and practical. In contrast to some of the evolutionary biologists he discusses, Lewens opts for a position of ostensible epistemic modesty (but also reduced accountability) in eschewing the claim that CET can provide a framework for unifying the social and biological sciences and rather suggests that it be "deferential" to work in "developmental and social psychology, ethnography, history, and so forth" (p183). That CET is not equal to the task of providing such a framework should not however be mistaken for an argument against the need and benefit of what a properly unifying framework could provide (long since the objective of philosophical anthropology).[6] But even understood only as a subsidiary "research program" its practical and normative implications should not be ignored. Through the optics of the Cultural Evolution Theory that Lewens, even if circumspectly, defends, humans can be grasped as no more than repositories of "information"; nor is there any place for societal learning as a normative achievement and thus no possible normative grounds for social critique.

[1] For an expanded account of this see Moss, L. (2014) "Detachment and compensation: Groundwork for a metaphysics of 'biosocial becoming'", Philosophy and Social Criticism 40 (1): 91-105, and Moss (2016) "The Hybrid Hominin: A Renewed Point of Departure for Philosophical Anthropology" in Naturalism and Philosophical Anthropology: Nature, Life, and the Human between Transcendental and Empirical Perspectives (Honenberger, P. Ed), Palgrave Macmillan.

[2] Richerson, P., and Boyd, R. (2005) Not by Genes Alone: How Culture Transformed Evolution. University of Chicago Press.

[3]See Donald, M. (2001) A Mind So Rare: The Evolution of Human Consciousness, New York: Norton and Donald, M. (1991) Origins of the Modern Mind: Three Stages in the Evolution of Culture and Cognition. Harvard University Press.

[4] See Tomasello, M. (2008) Origins of Human Communication. Cambridge: MIT Press and Tomasello, M. (2009) Why We Cooperate. MIT Press.

[5] See Hrdy, S. (2009) Mothers and Others: The Evolutionary Origins of Mutual Understanding. Harvard University Press.

[6] For an adumbration of what this might look like see op. cit. Moss 2014.