Current Continental Theory and Modern Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Stephen H. Daniel (ed.), Current Continental Theory and Modern Philosophy, Northwestern University Press, 2005, 290pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810122022.

Reviewed by Theodore R. Schatzki, University of Kentucky


Philosophy is peculiarly concerned with its own history. Scholars in other disciplines often weigh the validity of earlier ideas and draw on past thinkers and researchers. Only in philosophy, however, is it part of disciplinary education and practice to confront and take a stand on the (alleged) distinction between writing history and pursuing systematic issues. One portentous historical dividing line between so-called analytic and continental philosophy has been their divergent attitudes toward history and the different views this divergence implies on the distinction between writing history and addressing systematic issues. Whereas "continental" philosophers often pursue philosophical issues by working with and through the ideas of past thinkers, "analytic" philosophers infrequently do this, instead viewing history as a distinct subfield with little to contribute on current issues in epistemology, philosophy of language, or philosophy of mind. Historians also sometimes distance themselves from continental appropriations of past thinkers on the grounds that these thinkers should be taken on their own terms and in the context of past worlds.

A book titled Current Continental Theory and Modern Philosophy thus sounds very promising. All the more so since the interests contemporary continental theorists have in German thinkers from Kant to Heidegger is much better appreciated than is their engagement with the great modern thinkers preceding the Kšnigsberg Weiche. So, how are, can, and should contemporary continental theory and Western philosophy from Descartes to Kant be related? The greatest virtue of the book under review is that its contributions, collectively, provide a good sense of the varied ways in which contemporary continental thinkers have approached modern philosophy or can be used to interpret modern philosophers. The essays, however, accomplish this piece by piece. That is, they simply detail the interpretations particular contemporary thinkers offer of particular modern philosophers and/or use particular such thinkers to interpret particular such philosophers. Nowhere does the reader find a general, systematic, or reflective overview of the total field of entanglements, or of any large subfield of entanglements, between contemporary continental theory and modern philosophy. This lack means that questions of how these two complexes of thought do, can, and should be related are not addressed head-on.

Nominalists and other advocates of the significance of multiplicity and particulars will likely salute this form of presentation. More or less none, however, of the contemporary thinkers discussed in the book -- Althusser, Irigaray, Derrida, Kristeva, Le Doeuff, Levinas, even Deleuze -- fits this profile, though Deleuze's notion of the rhizome famously points in this direction. Nothing, therefore, should dissuade the reader from wondering whether the field of entanglements between contemporary continental and modern philosophy exhibits general features or is dominated by particular themes. Is this field, as the book's character suggests, simply a scatter of particular treatments of particular figures by particular thinkers?

First some facts about the thinkers considered. The "contemporary continental thinkers" discussed in the volume are really French theorists. In one essay Heidegger is gratuitously introduced to characterize Locke's ideas on property, and in a second essay Gadamer is drawn on, in a general and hand waving way, not to interpret Kant, the main philosopher discussed in the essay, but to fill out the author's own ideas on freedom/morality and language. Another notable fact is that Deleuze figures as principal continental thinker in six of the sixteen essays. This frequency reflects the situation that Deleuze is the only contemporary French thinker regularly to engage modern philosophy, with well-known works on Spinoza, Leibniz, Hume (as well as on Bergson and Nietzsche) and lesser-known writings on Kant. Althusser is the contemporary theorist figuring in the next largest number of essays (three). This is not, however, because of a sustained engagement with modern philosophy, but because of his formidable reputation as a systematic theorist and because there is pervasive ignorance of his interpretations of past thinkers. Of the remaining contemporary thinkers discussed, only Derrida appears in two essays. A final notable fact is that Spinoza is the principal modern philosopher in four of the essays, a fact reflective of the keen interest philosophers (and other humanist theorists) have recently taken in his thought. Machiavelli, Descartes, Leibniz, Locke, Hume, the Encyclopedists, Rousseau, and Kant appear in one or two articles alone.

As suggested, therefore, the volume offers good breadth. It also faithfully reflects contemporary emphases. Does, however, anything more than French and Modern unite its essays? Or, more directly stated, is there any reason to collect, in the form of a book, various discussions of French theorists on modern philosophers together with various uses of the former to interpret the latter? One possibility is that the different essays' treatments of particular thinkers form a rhizomatic structure: that complex relations among contemporary French thinkers underlie complex and intricate relations among their interpretations of, and the uses that can be made of them to interpret, canonical modern philosophers. This possibility is broached nowhere in the volume and is too complicated to explore in a review. Another possibility is that the essays are linked by certain overarching philosophical themes. In his introduction to the collection, the editor, Stephen H. Daniel, cites (xvi-xvii) materiality as a prominent theme in the book. Materiality does indeed repeatedly surface in the volume, as befits a topic of widespread 20th-century interest. Not only, however, do many essays not address this topic, but no other theme comes close to receiving the same attention. Indeed, a list of themes that appear in multiple essays reads like a partial enumeration of central ideas in recent French thought: difference, subject, origin, repetition, time, language, materiality.

A third possibility, offered by Daniel, is that the essays and the work of the French theorists they discuss exhibit three features: they unearth overlooked aspects of modern thought, they present or pursue new ways to study modern philosophy, and they identify the ideology- and power-rent sociohistorical practices that underlie modern texts.

I see the first feature. The essays often describe aspects of modern thought previously unknown at least to this nonspecialist reviewer, and I take Daniel at his word regarding specialists. I also affirm Daniel's claim (vii) that one reason the interpretations of contemporary continental thinkers accomplish this is that these thinkers bring concerns to the study of modern philosophy other than those found in the texts themselves. The flip-side of this claim is that mainstream (i.e., noncontinental) interpretations of modern philosophers approach these philosophers through the concerns articulated in their texts. I am not qualified to evaluate this proposition but note that it at least dovetails with the charge of anachronism that historians sometimes level at "analytic" philosophers who discuss historical thinkers.

The second and third features, however, do not really characterize the volume. I did not find much innovation in the way French thinkers were either depicted as encountering and discussing modern philosophers or used to interpret the latter. On the whole, the interpretations proffered by both the French theorists and the essays' authors are just that, interpretations, whose methods and the forms of whose presentation are at least familiar, though maybe not acceptable, to mainstream and traditional interpreters. The novelty of the interpretations lies, instead, in the revelation of previously unappreciated aspects of past philosophers' thought. Exceptions to these generalizations are found in the two essays that discuss Deleuze's approach to the history of the discipline (those of Jay Conway and Constantin Boundas). Of particular interest is Boundas's discussion of Deleuze's distinction between the history of philosophy and the becoming of philosophy. According to Deleuze, official history of philosophy oppresses thought by instructing philosophers to present the ideas of predecessors instead of thinking. To think, to do philosophy, means to "free life out of the space where it was imprisoned, one writes in order to trace lines of flight" (268; these are Deleuze's words). The philosopher who thinks does not flee past philosophers. Rather, he or she works through their texts to free concepts, assumptions, and the unsaid so that these elements can coalesce, with elements from other philosophies, as new concepts appearing in new assemblages of thought that are dedicated to questions and problems different from those animating past philosophers' texts. In proceeding thus, as does Deleuze when writing about past philosophers, the thinker participates in the becoming of philosophy. "Don't … interpret; experiment!" (276; again, Deleuze's words). Pace Daniel (xv), however, this does not seem to be an apt motto for the volume at large.

As for the third feature, that the volume's essays identify the ideology- and desire-riven sociohistorical practices that underlie past philosophers' ideas, I think it is fair to say that only two essays achieve this: Warren Montag's on Althusser and Locke and Robert Bernasconi's on Locke. In addition, Katherine Arens's essay on Kristeva, Deleuze and Guattari, and the Encyclopedists discusses the idea that theories are embedded in such practices, and Anthony David presents Irigaray's psychoanalytic interpretation of Descartes. Otherwise, the essays, as noted, offer interpretations that grapple with the ideas, arguments, assumptions, and unsaid of the texts of modern philosophers. A philosophical history that truly exhibits this third feature in exemplary fashion is Alasdair MacIntyre's A Short History of Ethics; mention here should also be made of Randall Collins's The Sociology of Philosophies (though I am not endorsing this book).

In short, what the volume amounts to is a map both of various, sometimes prominent encounters of French theorists with modern philosophers and of different uses that can be made of these theorist's ideas to interpret these philosophers. In addition, a few essays simply present their authors' ideas on "systematic" issues, ideas that are informed by the texts of modern and contemporary philosophers. These latter essays fit the volume's overall remit only in so far as their authors identify themselves as continental philosophers. All this, I believe, does not obviously make for a coherent book. Attention to the rhizomatic structure of contemporary French theory (assuming this exists) might have helped in this regard.

This said, I emphasize that the volume contains many excellent essays. I was particularly taken by Etienne Balibar's discussion of the body politic in Spinoza. Balibar depicts Spinoza as diverging from the typical fixation of modern political thought on individual and collective subjects in specifying the subject matter of political thought to be a field of movement in which collectives, states, and groups dissociate and coalesce in changing ways. Equally suggestive and enlightening was Miguel Vatter's claim that Deleuze's and Derrida's notion of "originary, historical repetition" first appears -- and in political form -- in Machiavelli's idea that revolution and Republican freedom must be theorized through notions of repetition and a return to beginnings. Other excellent essays include Pierre Macherey's analysis of the stakes and points of conflict between Pascal's and Spinoza's claims about the vacuum, Susan James's skeptical analysis of Althusser's appropriation of Spinoza in his, Althusser's, search for an "aleatory materialism," Stephen Daniel's discussion of Deleuze's reading of Leibniz, ­­­­­Bernasconi's provocative thesis that Locke recasts the relation between property and religious thought, and thereby helps initiate the modern world, by defending property inequalities as furthering God's design, and Boundas's discussion of Deleuze's approach to modern philosophers such as Kant. The remaining essays are uniformly informative about their subject matter and sometimes insightful and well-written. Those not previously mentioned are Linda MacAvoy on Levinas and Descartes, Todd May on Deleuze's Spinoza, Joel Reed on Althusser and Hume, Penelope Deutscher on Derrida and Derrida's Rousseau, and Dennis Schmidt on Gadamer and Hume.

All in all, there is something in this book for anyone interested in, or just curious about, contemporary French thought or the canon of modern philosophy. The person best served by this volume is the philosopher with capacious interests in or curiosity about these domains. The reader interested in this or that French thinker or modern philosopher will find something to read, but such a person might be better served by other collections. Indeed, one can imagine a variety of other sorts of volumes that would be more provocative and thought-inducing than this one is, including a collection on Deleuze and the history of philosophy, a volume on contemporary French (or continental) treatments of Spinoza, and collections that juxtapose "continental" and noncontinental interpretations of given past philosophers. Perhaps one or more of these books already exists (the closest I am aware of is Deleuze and Philosophy, edited by Keith Ansell Pearson). Alternatively, one can view Current Continental Theory and Modern Philosophy as a sort of reference work, useful for anyone who, over time, might want to think or learn about relations between French theorists and the canonical modern philosophers. Thought this way, the volume makes sense.