Current Controversies in Epistemology

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Ram Neta (ed.), Current Controversies in Epistemology, Routledge, 2014, 153pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415518147.

Reviewed by Eileen S. Nutting, University of Kansas


In the latest installment of Routledge's Current Controversies in Philosophy series, editor Ram Neta brings four pairs of prominent epistemologists into dialogue about contested issues at the center of the field. For students or philosophers with passing backgrounds in epistemology, the collection offers a gateway into a cluster of ideas at the heart of contemporary discussions. The specialist will find much of the material familiar, but will appreciate that the collection includes new insights and new approaches to central epistemic questions.

Each of the four debates in the volume addresses the ultimate sources or grounds of justification and knowledge. The debates feature: (1) C.S.I. Jenkins and Michael Devitt on a priori justification, (2) Richard Fumerton and Nicholas Silins on basic a posteriori justification, (3) Declan Smithies and Peter Klein on the justificational regress problem, and (4) Anthony Brueckner and Ernest Sosa on skepticism about the external world. Though presented as distinct, these debates overlap in illuminating ways.

Three central questions arise in multiple essays, across debates. (I) Must the evidential resources we rely upon to develop our concepts always play a justificatory role in the beliefs that result from applying those concepts? (II) Are we able to form any justified a posteriori beliefs without first ensuring that our belief-forming process is justified, or without addressing skepticism about the external world? If so, what kinds of justified a posteriori beliefs are immune to such concerns? (III) Can reflective knowledge be grounded in knowledge that is not reflective? The discussion below will draw out how these recurring questions intersect with the specific questions under debate.

There is much to like about this volume. But in one disappointing respect, it is typical of epistemology collections. Including the editor, eight of its nine contributors are men. Seven of its 216 total citations (3.2%), and three of the male contributors' 194 citations (1.5%), are to women.[1] The volume features more male authors than it does references to works written by women. Readers would do well to seek out supplementary sources to rectify this imbalance.

Numbers aside, the work of one woman -- Jenkins -- figures prominently. She contributes one of the volume's best essays. It appears in the first debate, in which she and Devitt address a priori justification. Jenkins thinks it exists, and Devitt thinks it does not. It is an admirably responsive debate; each engages seriously and specifically with the other's views. But it is somewhat atypical as a debate on the a priori. Usually defenders of the a priori come from roughly rationalist perspectives. Jenkins does not; both she and Devitt are naturalists. Unusual though it may be, there is value in casting the debate in this way. Accepting a priori justification is a foregone conclusion for those of a rationalist bent. It is a more pressing issue for those of a naturalist bent.

Jenkins and Devitt agree that all concepts are empirically grounded; we rely on experience to develop our conceptual understanding. The crux of their debate comes down to whether or not concepts grounded in this way can be analyzed a priori. Jenkins thinks that they can, and that such conceptual analysis can produce a priori justification. Devitt thinks that the reasoning process Jenkins identifies as conceptual analysis either (a) is not a priori, despite appearances, or (b) depends on an unjustified belief about the nature of conceptual connections, and hence does not yield justification.

On Jenkins's account, once we possess empirically-grounded concepts, we can form justified beliefs solely on the basis of our understanding of the relevant concepts. To do so is to perform a priori conceptual analysis. Despite the fact that we formed our concepts using empirical resources, some of our beliefs about them are not justified by appeal to empirical evidence. Instead, they are justified by our empirically-developed conceptual competence. Since these beliefs are not justified by empirical evidence, they are justified a priori.

Devitt denies that there is such a priori conceptual analysis; all of our beliefs about the connections between concepts are justified through empirical observation. He argues for this view by attacking an assumption that he takes Jenkins and other defenders of the a priori to endorse: Cartesianism. This is the view that part of what it is to possess a concept is to have tacit knowledge of its relations to other concepts. Devitt, however, claims that a person could not have such knowledge. A person would not be justified in believing that there is a constitutive or logical relation between <bachelor> and <unmarried>, rather than a mere familiar association. Cartesianism places impossible requirements on concept possession.

Unfortunately, Devitt's presentation of this argument against Cartesianism is not ideally accessible. To follow it, a reader must understand a somewhat unsavory illustrative example: the type of connection that holds between the concepts <bachelor> and <envied>. Most of the men I asked understood this example, but most of the women I asked did not. I only understood the argument after two of the men in my life sheepishly explained the nature of the intended conceptual connection to me. Some readers, especially women, might find this frustrating.

The second debate, between Fumerton and Silins, is about whether or not perceptual experience can ever provide basic (non-inferential) justification for belief. Silins argues that it can; Fumerton argues that it cannot. As in the first debate, the two participants agree upon much. Fumerton and Silins both are internalists about justification. They take externalism and skeptical concerns seriously. They even appeal to the same skeptical scenario -- the so-called 'new evil demon' -- to motivate their rejections of externalism about perceptual justification. In part because basic perceptual justification is a much more salient concern for internalists than it is for externalists, the common ground again makes for a fitting debate.

The most fundamental disagreement between Fumerton and Silins seems to be about the role of skeptical concerns in a posteriori justification. Fumerton argues that skepticism must be quelled for any perceptual justification to be licensed. Silins contests that some beliefs grounded in perceptual experience are immune from skeptical worries. For example, upon experiencing pain, one is justified in believing herself to be in pain. Such beliefs are not about the external world; they are about the way experiences seem. Beliefs with basic a posteriori justification, Silins thinks, are of this sort.

It might seem obvious that Silins is right; external world skepticism cannot undermine experience-based beliefs about how experiences seem. But Fumerton argues that we appeal to the external world both in forming and in applying the concepts we use to describe our ordinary experiences. To genuinely possess the concept <red>, for example, we must appreciate that the appearance of red things varies with the lighting conditions. This involves an appeal to external objects. Furthermore, when we judge something to be red, our judgment is contingent on assumptions about the lighting conditions. Fumerton believes our judgment -- our belief -- is only justified if these background assumptions are justified. This, he thinks, requires a response to skepticism.

Fumerton's preferred response to skepticism involves an appeal to inference to the best explanation. An external world of the expected sort provides the best explanation of our totality of perceptual experiences -- experiences in the past and present, including experiences from different sensory modalities. Accordingly, he thinks, perceptual beliefs can only be justified by an inference from all these past experiences.

This might sound reminiscent of Devitt's view. According to both Fumerton and Devitt, beliefs are justified by vast networks of background beliefs, including ones about sensory experiences. Both believe that the resources required to ground concepts ultimately play some role in justifying the beliefs formed by appeal to those concepts. However, they differ in the resources they believe to be required. Fumerton believes that the justification of perceptual beliefs depends, in part, on a priori justified beliefs about evidential connections. To some extent, he is a typical, rationalist-minded defender of the a priori of the sort absent from the first debate.

Insofar as Fumerton and Devitt have similar views, Silins and Jenkins do as well. Fumerton and Devitt both think that the evidence that we use to acquire and develop our concepts becomes part of the justificatory chain. Silins and Jenkins both think otherwise. They believe that we can analyze or apply a concept in a justificatory way without appealing to the way we acquired that concept.

Silins's main criticism against Fumerton's picture is that it over-intellectualizes the justificatory process. On Fumerton's account, any justified belief grounded in perceptual experience is justified in part by a response to skepticism -- in particular, by an inference to the best explanation. But Silins insists that this constraint sets the justificatory bar too high. Children, for example, lack the conceptual resources required to appeal to inference to the best explanation in observing that Elmo is red (or that is red). Fumerton's view, then, has the implausible consequence that children lack a posteriori justification. Silins concludes that we should reject Fumerton's view. Some beliefs are justified by experience alone, even without a response to skepticism.

The Fumerton/Silins debate overlaps considerably with the next debate, between Smithies and Klein on the justificational regress problem. Smithies defends a foundationalist solution, and Klein an infinitist one. To defend foundationalism, Smithies appeals to a claim he calls 'the experience thesis'. This is the same claim that Silins defends in his essay on the a posteriori: that some beliefs have basic justification in virtue of being suitably related to experience.

Although Smithies uses it to defend foundationalism, the experience thesis does not entail foundationalism. It entails that some justified beliefs are foundationally justified, not that all are. But Smithies suggests that a uniform solution to the regress problem is preferable to a hybrid solution. If so, then the existence of some beliefs with basic justification gives us reason to think that all justificatory chains end in basic beliefs. If so, the experience thesis motivates foundationalism, without entailing it.

Smithies defends the thesis with both an intuitive argument and a more theoretical argument. The latter targets standard opponents, including Klein. They typically argue against the experience thesis by appeal to access internalism: the view that a belief is justified if and only if an appropriate higher-order belief is also justified. Smithies argues that it is self-defeating to use this view to argue against the experience thesis; access internalism is only plausible if the experience thesis is true. The details of this argument are interesting. But, unfortunately, Klein does not address it.

Instead, Klein focuses his argument against foundationalism on reflective knowledge, which he calls 'Meno knowledge'. Reflective knowledge is, approximately, knowledge that we are prepared to justify with reasons. (In contrast, animal knowledge does not require reasons; it might result, e.g., from reliability.) Klein rejects foundationalism on the basis of an argument that foundationally justified beliefs are incapable of giving rise to the kind of justification that allows us to have reflective knowledge.

His argument depends on two claims. First, no reflective knowledge can be basic; all reflective knowledge must be justified inferentially. Second, only reflective knowledge has an epistemic status capable of justifying further reflective knowledge. Together, these entail that all reflective knowledge must be justified inferentially from other reflective knowledge. If all justification has to be non-circular, then Klein reaches his own preferred view of infinitism: all reflective knowledge must be inferentially justified in a non-circular way.

Klein's argument for infinitism forms the crux of his discussed disagreement with Smithies. While Klein claims that only reflective knowledge can justify further reflective knowledge, Smithies thinks that animal knowledge can justify reflective knowledge just as well. Their disagreement seems to emerge from a disagreement about access internalism.

Both Klein and Smithies endorse access internalism; they think that higher-order justification is reflectively accessible when we have knowledge. But Klein only endorses access internalism in the case of reflective knowledge. Smithies endorses it for all knowledge, animal or reflective. On Smithies's view, animal knowledge and reflective knowledge do not differ in propositional justification. They do, however, differ in doxastic justification; reflective knowledge is believed on the basis of reasoning that makes readily available the higher-order propositional justification that already must exist, given access internalism. If the distinction is drawn this way, then animal knowledge (of higher-order justification) can give rise to reflective knowledge just as well as reflective knowledge can.

In the last debate, between Sosa and Brueckner on skepticism, it becomes clear that Sosa also disagrees with Klein. For reasons that differ sharply from Smithies's, Sosa believes that reflective knowledge emerges from animal knowledge. His account starts with an externalist (and foundationalist) picture of animal knowledge. Reflective knowledge, or reflective justification, arises as a result of the right sort of 'coherence-enhanced' reflection on animal knowledge. The resulting picture is one of 'dawning justification', and Sosa thinks it dodges the few skeptical concerns that have any real traction. Reflection on coherence gives us reason to reject the dream scenario, and it also ensures that we avoid objectionable epistemic bootstrapping (e.g., from reliable knowledge directly to knowledge of reliability).

Brueckner's take on skepticism, while good-humored, is less sanguine. He casts himself as a docent in a museum of skepticism, offering brief accounts of some of its most notable pieces. (The essay is called 'Skeptical Mystery Tour'.) The tour starts with Descartes's evil demon scenario, and continues through seven attempted solutions to skepticism about the external world. None of these proposed solutions strike Brueckner as terribly promising; for each, he suggests plausible objections available in the existing literature.

Sadly, this essay is one of Brueckner's last. Brueckner, a philosopher well-respected for his many significant contributions to epistemology, died shortly before the volume's publication. A touching dedication to him appears on the book's copyright page.

Taken together, the volume presents an interesting mix. Some of the essays would be useful for those with little background in the relevant questions. Brueckner gives a useful overview of some of the key moves and ideas in the skeptical literature. Smithies sets out the justificational regress problem in a way that is both precise and accessible. Some of the essays provide interesting insight into the existing literature. For example, the prominent and easily misunderstood views of Devitt and Klein gain significant clarity, in large part because Jenkins and Smithies present the issues relevant to their debates in a way that casts light on potentially murky details of the views. The individual essays and debates contribute in different ways to the controversies discussed. And the collection as a whole offers a robust picture of the complexity and interdependence of central questions about justification.

[1] Brueckner cites a paper by Sherrilyn Roush, Silins cites one by Susanna Siegel, and Devitt cites a book by Jenkins in his reply to her. In addition, Jenkins cites three of her own works and a paper by Louise Antony.  My count does not include Brueckner's citation to a male-authored paper in a volume edited by Susana Nuccetelli.