Current Controversies in Experimental Philosophy

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Edouard Machery and Elizabeth O'Neill (eds.), Current Controversies in Experimental Philosophy, Routledge, 2014, 160pp., $38.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415519670.

Reviewed by Yuri Cath, La Trobe University


This collection is an excellent addition to Routledge's Current Controversies in Philosophy series. Together the different entries compose a snappy and accessible introduction to experimental philosophy for those who are new to the subject whilst still providing plenty of material that will interest specialists. The introduction by Edouard Machery and Elizabeth O'Neill also gives a helpful overview of some of the big picture questions about experimental philosophy and its relationship to more traditional forms of philosophy.

The collection is organized into four parts, each consisting of two chapters defending opposing positions on a given topic. This collection is not long enough to use as the sole basis for an entire course on experimental philosophy as the individual entries are fairly short and there are some important debates in and about experimental philosophy that the collection does not cover. But it would form a good basis for such a course in conjunction with selected papers. And an innovative supplement to the collection is that for each part there is an accompanying Philosophy TV discussion between the authors of the opposing chapters, which looks like it would be a great resource for students.

Part 1, 'Language', features two chapters debating the value of the survey studies of Machery et al (2004), which were offered as evidence of cross-cultural differences in folk intuitions about the reference of proper names. In Chapter 1 Machery defends the claim that these studies have important implications for Kripke's arguments against descriptivism against criticisms by Max Deutsch (2009, 2010) and Genoveva Martí (2009, 2012), who each argue (in different ways) that these experimental results are irrelevant because Kripke's arguments do not rely on the use of intuitions as evidence. In Chapter 2 Martí presents her case for this irrelevancy charge, appealing to the idea that Kripke's arguments only rely on observations of how people use proper names and not on people's intuitions about how they use names. Martí argues that such intuitions are, at best, a guide to how people think they use names and not how they actually use them. A slightly odd feature of the presentation is that Machery's chapter appears first and discusses claims made in Martí's chapter, but Martí does not discuss Machery's chapter, reversing the more natural order followed in the rest of the book. Perhaps it was just an effect of this ordering, but it seemed to me this debate would have been improved if Martí's chapter had included a reply to Machery's criticisms. As it was, it felt like this interesting debate needed to go on for just a bit longer.

Part 2, 'Consciousness', is concerned with experimental studies of folk psychology. In Chapter 3 Brian Fiala, Adam Arico and Shaun Nichols discuss how their agency model of folk attributions of mental states relates to the survey studies of Justin Sytsma and Machery (2010) involving "Jimmy", a hypothetical robot they described in different vignettes. According to Fiala et al.'s model, mental state attributions are based on a dual-process cognitive system, consisting of a low road process (fast and domain specific) and a high road process (slow and domain general). The low road process attributes mental states based on whether the relevant entity has certain cue properties like having facial features, and moving and interacting in distinctive ways.  Fiala et al.'s model predicts that when this low-road processing is triggered, subjects will be disposed to attribute a wide range of mental states to entities which have these features. But this prediction seems to conflict with Sytsma and Machery (2010), who found that subjects didn't attribute certain kinds of mental states to Jimmy even though he is described as having some of these cue properties.  Fiala et al. discuss how the agency model can accommodate these findings if we think of the subjects as having a disposition to attribute the relevant mental states that is overridden by high-road processing, and they present findings from a new study in support of this hypothesis. In Chapter 4 Sytsma raises worries about the setup of Fiala et al.'s study, which he supports with four follow-up studies that found a different pattern of responses after making various adjustments to the experiments that Fiala et al. ran. However, Sytsma also argues that Fiala et al.'s agency model is consistent with the negative hypothesis that Sytsma and Machery (2010) advanced, namely, that the existence of phenomenally conscious mental states is not obviously true from the first-person perspective.

Part 3, 'Free Will and the Scientific Vision', is concerned with experimental studies of people's free actions and moral responsibility. In Chapter 5 Joshua Knobe makes a distinction between "two broad visions of human action" (p. 69): the scientific vision and the transcendence vision. According to the scientific view one's actions are caused by one's mental states, whereas on the transcendence view one's "actions are caused by nothing at all" (p. 69). Knobe thinks that the hypothesis that the folk conception of action most resembles the transcendence vision gives the best explanation of a range of different survey studies probing intuitions about free will and moral responsibility in deterministic worlds. In Chapter 6 Eddy Nahmias and Morgan Thompson suggest that the folk conception of human action is theory-lite in such a way that it is compatible with a naturalistic view of human action because it is not committed to substantive claims about the metaphysical underpinnings of human action. They report on new studies they have done which they take to support this position.

Part 4, "Epistemology and the Reliability of Intuition", is concerned with questions about the reliability and trustworthiness of epistemic intuitions. In Chapter 7 Kenneth Boyd and Jennifer Nagel argue that there are good reasons to expect that epistemic intuitions will generally be a reliable guide to the nature of knowledge itself, appealing to claims about the function of knowledge attributions. They go on to raise concerns about various experimentalist challenges to the practice of using epistemic intuitions as evidence in epistemology. They conclude that: "Epistemic intuition is not infallible, but at present it looks reliable enough to continue serving its traditional function of supplying us with valuable evidence about the nature of knowledge" (p. 124). In Chapter 8 Joshua Alexander and Jonathan M. Weinberg respond by appealing to an ambiguity they perceive in the term "reliability" between what they call the baseline accuracy versus the trustworthiness senses of reliability (which for convenience I'll refer to as 'reliabilityba' and 'reliabilityt'). Applied to intuitions, their distinction (at least when first introduced, p. 130) seems to be this: a given class of intuitions is reliableba just in case the contents of those intuitions are true some suitably large proportion of the time, where that proportion is set invariantly. On the other hand, a class of intuitions is reliablet just in case the contents of those intuitions are true some suitably large proportion of the time, where that proportion is domain and purpose relative. According to Alexander and Weinberg, Boyd and Nagel are concerned with defending the overall reliabilityba of our epistemic intuitions, what Alexander and Weinberg call the general reliability thesis (GRT). However, Alexander and Weinberg claim that proponents of the experimentalist challenge need not contest GRT because their critique only relies on the claim that intuitions are not reliablet.

A lot could be said about every chapter; they are all high quality. I will confine myself to a few thoughts about Chapter 8. As described above, the strategy of Alexander and Weinberg's response to Boyd and Nagel seems clear but I found the details hard to follow. What I found confusing is that Alexander and Weinberg end up appealing to various different ideas when discussing what the experimentalist critique does rely on, most of which don't seem to rely on their ambiguity claim. For example, after introducing this claim Alexander and Weinberg suggest that the experimentalist critique does not challenge GRT because it only relies on the claim that (1) there exist "worries about our intuitions about specific hypothetical cases or families of cases" (p. 131). This might be right but this point only requires a distinction between attributing a property to a subset of epistemic intuitions versus attributing it to all epistemic intuitions rather than any distinction between different senses of "reliability". In the following section, they switch to the claim that (2) epistemic intuitions are at threat of "unwelcome and unexpected intuitional sensitivity". But, again, this claim looks very different from the claim that epistemic intuitions are not reliablet (as far as I could tell neither entails the other), and Alexander and Weinberg never state what they take the relationship to be between these two claims. Finally, in other places they appeal to the claim that (3) unlike perception, we do not have good means of checking when our epistemic intuitions are incorrect. The only place where their distinction between two senses of "reliability" appeared to do much work was on pp. 136-137, where they appeal to the purpose relativity of reliabilityt. The idea in this discussion seemed to be that when our purpose is using intuitions as inputs into philosophical theorizing, those intuitions will have to be correct some very high proportion of the time in order for them to qualify as being reliablet.[1]

I had some difficulties then in nailing down Alexander and Weinberg's views on what the experimentalist critique is committed to saying about our epistemic intuitions. They might reply that all that matters is that (1)-(3) are each examples of claims that are consistent with GRT and which could support a critique of the use of epistemic intuitions in epistemology. Fair enough, but then why place so much weight on the distinction between two senses of reliability? And in attributing various different, and not clearly distinguished, claims to the experimentalist critique, one had the feeling that Boyd and Nagel were being asked to defend epistemic intuitions from a moving target.

More importantly, I think Alexander and Weinberg misrepresent Boyd and Nagel when suggesting that they merely raise considerations that could be used to defend GRT. Boyd and Nagel identify various prima facie reasons for doubting whether experimental philosophers have established versions of (1)-(3). For example, in relation to (1) and (2), Boyd and Nagel do all of the following: identify studies which failed to replicate Weinberg et al.'s (2001) findings of cross cultural variation in Gettier intuitions; express concerns about the empirical credentials of Richard Nisbett's views on cultural differences in cognition which influenced Weinberg et al (2001); criticise studies by Wesley Buckwalter and Stephen Stich (2013) and Christina Starmans and Ori Friedman (2009), which purport to show that Gettier intuitions are gender sensitive; identify a study which failed to replicate the findings of Starman and Friedman; and discuss how studies by Jennifer Cole Wright (2010) give us reason to think that Stacey Swain et al. (2008) overestimate the contextual variation of epistemic intuitions. And, in relation to (3), Boyd and Nagel note that Wright (2010) also provides some reasons to think that one's degree of confidence in one's intuitions might be a guide to their reliability. Of course, Alexander and Weinberg could dispute the legitimacy or significance of any of the various experimental and theoretical considerations that Boyd and Nagel discuss, and they do offer brief replies to some of these considerations. For example, they suggest (p. 132) that the studies that Boyd and Nagel criticise are not that important to the experimentalist's challenge, which can rely instead on evidence from other kinds of studies. But, on the whole, they forgo detailed discussion of the considerations Boyd and Nagel offer to focus instead on the complaint that Boyd and Nagel's chapter does not even address the experimentalist's critique because they fail to heed an important ambiguity in the word "reliability", an objection that seemed like a red herring.

Furthermore, suppose we endorse Alexander and Weinberg's reasonable looking claim that the truth of GRT is at best a necessary but not a sufficient condition for the trustworthiness of intuitions (p. 128). It does not follow that GRT is irrelevant to evaluating the experimentalist's critique. For the truth of GRT might still provide us with grounds to regard, say, Gettier intuitions as being trustworthy until shown to be otherwise even if it does not entail that they are so worthy. And these grounds, together with the kinds of concerns Boyd and Nagel raise about studies that purport to show that Gettier intuitions are not trustworthy, might make it reasonable to continue to view Gettier intuitions in this light even after considering the experimental results which have been offered as evidence of their untrustworthiness. Again, Alexander and Weinberg provide arguments that may outweigh such considerations,[2] but the point remains that GRT is relevant to evaluating the experimentalist's challenge.

At one juncture Alexander and Weinberg advise that:

philosophers have to resist the temptation to jump too quickly to broad philosophical conclusions based on what individual studies seem to show. Science is slow business, and we need to resist the urge to make it go faster simply because that would better suit our philosophical goals (p. 138).

This advice is offered to philosophers, like Boyd and Nagel, who appeal to experimental studies to defend the way intuitions are currently used in philosophy. But this advice should cut both ways, applying equally well to philosophers, like Alexander and Weinberg, who infer sweeping conclusions about how philosophy should be practiced on the basis of their own preferred subset of the current results we have from experimental philosophy (Alexander and Weinberg suggest that there should be local restrictions on the use of certain unnamed intuitions and a global shift in how we use intuitions in general, p. 133). My own impression is that, so far, the overall picture these results provide of the origins and reliability of our intuitions is too conflicted and preliminary to support these ambitious inferences. And this is not to say anything of the further bridging premises about philosophical methodology that such inferences rely on, premises which seem to become ever more contestable the closer they are inspected (see e.g. the debates about whether intuitions really do play a crucial evidential role in philosophy). But I'm in danger now of merely sharing my metaphilosophical opinions and Alexander and Weinberg have plenty of interesting things to say in support of their very different opinions. Let me close instead by returning to my opinions of this volume. This is a very good collection. If you're at all interested in experimental philosophy you will want to get your hands on a copy.


Buckwalter, W, and Stich, S. 2013. Gender and Philosophical Intuition. In J. Knobe and S. Nichols (eds.), Experimental Philosophy, Volume 2. Oxford University Press.

Deutsch, M. 2009. Experimental Philosophy and the Theory of Reference. Mind and Language 24 (4): 445-466.

Deutsch, M. 2010. Intuitions, Counter-Examples, and Experimental Philosophy. Review of Philosophy and Psychology 1 (3): 447-460.

Martí, G. 2009. Against Semantic Multi-Culturalism. Analysis 69 (1): 42-48.

Martí. G. 2012 Empirical Data and the Theory of Reference. W. Kabasenche, M. O'Rourke, M. Slater, (eds.) Topics in Contemporary Philosophy: Reference and Referring. MIT Press.

Starmans, C. and Friedman O. 2012. The Folk Conception of Knowledge. Cognition 124 (3): 272-283.

Swain, S. Alexander, J. and Weinberg, J. 2008. The Instability of Philosophical Intuitions: Running Hot and Cold on Truetemp. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 76 (1):138-155.

Weinberg, J. Nichols, S and Stich, S. 2001. Normativity and Epistemic Intuitions. Philosophical Topics, 29 (1-2):429-460.

Wright, J. 2010. On Intuitional Stability: The Clear, the Strong, and the Paradigmatic. Cognition 115 (3): 491-503.

[1] Alexander and Weinberg reason that as intuitive counterexamples trump theories in philosophy -- a claim they support by appealing to the reaction to Gettier's cases -- then the stakes involved when philosophers use intuitions will be very high because a false intuition could lead to large scale errors in our revised theories (p. 134 and p. 136). One worry with this line of argument is that it is debatable how representative the Gettier case is. For example, consider instead how physicalists respond to the knowledge argument or how consequentialists respond to trolley cases. Alexander and Weinberg might point out that even in these cases the proponent of the relevant theory is obliged to explain away the intuition they reject. But the potential cost of philosophers wasting their time by trying to explain away intuitions that were untrustworthy in the first place doesn't seem like such a terrible cost to risk incurring, especially when weighed against the cost of avoiding apparent truths about the subject one is investigating.

[2] For example, Alexander and Weinberg suggest that there is an important difference between thought experiments and the usual situations in which we employ our epistemic capacities that "will weaken an attempted inference from accuracy on the later to our trustworthiness in using the former" (p. 135). The disanalogy Alexander and Weinberg appeal to is that thought experiments often "include highly specific information about an agent's mental states" (p. 135), whereas in everyday life "we typically have rather sparser, noisier access to what is going on in someone's head" (p. 135). This line of argument struck me as unpromising because in everyday life we not only have the capacity to attribute judgments about what mental states people are in on the basis of limited evidence but we can also evaluate conditionals which embed claims attributing highly specific mental states (e.g. "If Tony had known about the party, then he would have wanted to be here").