Current Controversies in Philosophy of Mind

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Uriah Kriegel (ed.), Current Controversies in Philosophy of Mind, Routledge, 2014, 250pp., $33.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415530873.

Reviewed by Torin Alter, The University of Alabama


This is a well-crafted collection on topics at the leading edge of the philosophy of mind. It has five parts, each containing two chapters that approach their topic in different and often opposing ways. All ten chapters make valuable contributions, and Kriegel’s lucid introduction provides a helpful overview. If one wants to get a feel for the debates engaging philosophers of mind today, then Current Controversies is an excellent source. But do not be misled: despite the suggestion on the first page and back cover that the book is “for a student audience,” the chapters read like articles in professional journals.

Part I concerns a view associated with Bertrand Russell’s 1927 Analysis of Matter that David Chalmers (1997) has dubbed “Russellian monism”. On this view, “consciousness is constituted by the intrinsic properties of fundamental physical entities: that is, by the categorical bases of fundamental physical dispositions” (Chalmers 2003, p. 129). The view is of current interest partly because it promises to both integrate consciousness deeply into the natural, causal order and sidestep influential anti-physicalist attacks such as the knowledge argument (Jackson 1982)[1]

Both chapters in Part I examine how best to develop Russellian monism. The first is by Daniel Stoljar, who sees the view as starting with the idea that physics fails to describe certain physical properties that help explain how consciousness emerges from physical processes (19). He distinguishes what he takes to be four versions of Russellian monism according to how they explicate that inchoate idea, and he argues that only the fourth is viable. The first two are not representative of contemporary Russellian monist views, and so I will concentrate on the third and fourth.

The third version of Russellian monism that Stoljar considers lies at the heart of most discussions of the view.  We might call this version structuralist Russellian monism.  It is inspired by Russell’s structuralist view about physics, on which the aim of this science is “to discover what we may call the causal skeleton of the world” (1927, p. 391). According to structuralist Russellian monism, physics describes only “causal skeletal properties” (28) or, as in Chalmers’ version, “truths about structure and dynamics.” Structuralist Russellian monism also holds that there are nonstructural properties that both underlie causal skeletal properties and (at least partly) constitute consciousness.

Stoljar’s objections to structuralist Russellian monism are indirect. The main one concerns the notion of a structural-dynamic description. Chalmers (2012, p. 335) presents a theory of spatiotemporal concepts that, according to Stoljar, renders that notion unsuitable for structuralist Russellian monism’s purposes. But even if it does,[2] Stoljar does not show that structuralist Russellian monism must be combined with that theory.

Stoljar favors a fourth view, on which the crucial distinction is between properties expressed by predicates of “our total current scientific theory” (32) and properties expressed by predicates of a final theory, in David Lewis’ sense: a theory that delivers “a true and complete inventory of those fundamental properties that play an active role in the actual workings of nature” (Lewis 2009, p. 205). This approach differs markedly from that of the other three views Stoljar considers. On those views, the class of properties that physics fails to describe is identified “by a priori reflection on physical science, and related matters” (31). By contrast, on the view Stoljar favors, this is an empirical matter. Consequently, distinctions emphasized by Russell and by (at least) most Russellian monists, such as that between structural and nonstructural properties, may play little or no role in this view. It is therefore unclear that the view should qualify as Russellian monism at all. Perhaps the view would be better cast as a distinct but related view: Stoljarian monism, perhaps?[3]

Derk Pereboom develops his own version of Russellian monism in his chapter. We might call this view Pereboomian Russellian monism. It employs a distinction, derived from Leibniz and Kant, between comparatively and absolutely intrinsic properties. Roughly, a comparatively intrinsic property is an intrinsic property the instantiation of which is necessitated by instantiations of extrinsic properties, in the way that a sphere’s shape is necessitated by spatial relations among its parts. Absolutely intrinsic properties are intrinsic properties that are not comparatively intrinsic. On Pereboomian Russellian monism, the absolutely intrinsic properties are what physics fails to describe.

Pereboomian Russellian monism is naturally seen as a sort of structuralist Russellian monism, with causal skeletal properties construed as extrinsic-or-comparatively-intrinsic properties and the underlying properties construed as absolutely intrinsic properties. Oddly, Pereboom classifies Pereboomian Russellian monism as a version of the fourth view Stoljar considers (41, 63 n.5). But unlike on the latter view, the distinction at the core of Pereboomian Russellian monism is drawn by a priori reflection—or at least by reflection that is as a priori as that which grounds the analogous distinctions in the other three views that Stoljar considers. In any event, Pereboom’s constructive, nuanced discussion is (for me at least) one of the book’s highlights.

Part II concerns embodied cognition, which is roughly the idea that bodily phenomena play crucial roles in thought. Recently, projects associated with that idea have proliferated, in both science and philosophy. But the projects are diverse in nature and, according to Kriegel, “the literature on embodied cognition has tended to be fuzzy on . . . foundational matters” (5). In particular, there is no consensus on how to understand the notion of embodiment for the purposes of the embodied cognition research program. Lawrence Shapiro and Alvin Goldman debate the latter issue in their chapters.

Both authors focus on Goldman’s (2012) proposal, which involves the notion of bodily formats: mental representations in the brain that “are (originally) dedicated to representing . . . bodily states and bodily activity from an internal point view” (100). Bodily formats can be redeployed for other purposes, and Goldman regards that as the key to understanding embodiment. Here is his proposal:

Cognition (token) C is a specimen of embodied cognition if and only if C uses some (internal) bodily format to help execute a cognitive task (whatever the task may be). (102)

Consider an example. Bhalla and Proffitt (1999) report that subjects wearing a heavy backpack estimated the slant of a long hill extending in front of them to be greater than did subjects in the control group. This is sometimes taken to indicate that perception is embodied, but what exactly does that mean? Goldman’s proposal delivers an answer: representations dedicated to representing the state of one’s back have been redeployed for use in a perceptual judgment about hill slant.

Goldman’s proposal has much going for it, as he and Shapiro both demonstrate. Shapiro also presents objections. A main one is that it implies that the embodied cognition research program departs less radically from traditional cognitive science than some of its practitioners seem to suggest. On Goldman’s proposal, “cognition turns out to be an exclusively neural event” (84). That might disappoint those (e.g., Clark 1999) who emphasize “devaluing the brain’s centrality in cognition” (84). In response, Goldman grants that his proposal is not for everyone but argues that it is far from trivial. The disagreement between Goldman and Shapiro stems largely, if not entirely, from what each would like a definition of embodiment to capture. That issue may seem insubstantial. But how it is resolved might help us understand the significance, philosophical and otherwise, of the embodied cognition research program.

Part III concerns representationalism and moods. Representationalism says that phenomenal character is nothing but intentional character, i.e., that what-it’s-like-ness consists in representing the world in a certain way. Moods make trouble for this view in a way that perception does not. My current visual experience is directed at the words I am typing. But what is my depression about? It is not clear that moods even have intentional character. So, how could representationalism be true of them? Amy Kind and Angela Mendelovici tackle this problem in their chapters.

Kind argues that the problem is insurmountable. She suggests that it might be possible to show that moods sometimes lack intentional character altogether (124). But in her main argument she grants her representationalist opponents that this is never the case—that moods are always intentional. Representationalism about moods fails even on that assumption, she argues, because the intensity of phenomenal character and intentional character can vary independently. For example, a father’s elation may deepen as he rocks his newborn to sleep without her seeming “rosier and more wonderful to him” (127)—indeed, without there being any corresponding change in how he represents her. Moreover, Kind argues, this is true regardless of how representationalists construe the objects at which moods are directed.

Kind develops her argument with precision and force. But she makes one move I object to. In several places, she describes representationalism more or less as I have, as the view that phenomenality is nothing but intentionality. But in the opening section of her chapter, she suggests that representationalism is defined partly by its role in a physicalist strategy for solving the hard problem of consciousness. Here is the idea: there is no hard problem of intentionality—no mystery about how intentionality could be wholly physical—and so establishing that phenomenality is nothing but intentionality would convert the hard problem of consciousness into an easy problem.[4] However, although representationalism was originally motivated by that strategy (Harman 1990), these days there are many nonreductive representationalists, who hold that phenomenal states are wholly intentional and that both phenomenology and intentionality pose a hard problem (e.g., Chalmers 2004 and Gray 2010).  Building the physicalist strategy into the definition of “representationalism” is therefore misleading.

Mendelovici develops a representationalist view of moods and emotions in her chapter. She proposes that these states represent sui generis affective properties:  properties that are neither “ordinary physical properties,” such as “dangerousness or threateningness” (140), nor dispositional  properties (143). She writes, “Affective properties are exactly those familiar qualities we experience when we are angry, sad, and so forth” (143). Such properties, she argues, are uninstantiated. Suppose I experience joy when I execute a graceful forehand loop in table tennis. My emotion represents the loop as having joyfulness. But the loop has no such property. Nothing does. She treats moods similarly to emotions, except that moods can represent (sui generis, uninstantiated) affective properties as not bound to any particular object. This, she suggests, “accounts for the apparent lack of directness in undirected moods” (150), as in the case of free-floating euphoria.

Mendelovici responds to Kind’s objection concerning intensity by suggesting that changes in a mood’s intensity correspond to changes in which affective property is represented: “changes in mood involve a representational change analogous to the change one undergoes when one thinks cat and then thinks octopus. The property before one’s mind’s eye changes” (151). Kind finds that response implausible (128). I can see why. The suggestion that as the father’s elation deepens he thereby represents a series of distinct affective properties seems prima facie contrived. I am less sure that this concern suffices to reject Mendelovici’s view.

The main advantage Mendelovici claims for her view over rival representationalist accounts is that hers “gets the phenomenology right” (145). But this seems to depend on how, on her view, sui generous affective properties are represented. If she held, for example, that in moods they are represented unconsciously, then her view would not get the phenomenology right. Presumably, she takes the properties themselves to determine the phenomenology. This complicates matters, at least for the philosophers Kind describes, who contend that representationalism should deliver a physicalist solution to the hard problem. It is not obvious that representing sui generis affective properties in the relevant way is wholly physical.

Part IV concerns some more basic questions about mental representation.  What exactly is mental representation? How does it work? How is it even possible? Chapters by Uriah Kriegel and Robert Rupert address these questions.

Kriegel begins with a brain-in-a-vat scenario in which whenever the simulating machine is in state S1 the envatted brain has an experience that is subjectively indistinguishable from one he normally has when he sees an apple. What does the envatted brain’s experience represent? Hilary Putnam (1981) suggests that the answer is S1, and “tracking” theories, which dominate the literature on mental representation, tend to agree. But Kriegel thinks there is another, equally legitimate answer: the experience represents “an apple-looking thing” (163) because that is “what the experience presents to the subject” (162). In his view, these answers do not compete. Rather, there are two “fundamentally different kinds of [mental] representation” (165), objective and subjective. These can come apart, though “only in the fantastic circumstances of the thought experiment” (162).  Kriegel does not rule out the idea that one of the two kinds of representation can be reduced to the other. But he opposes eliminativist views on which one of the two kinds of representation does not exist.

In his chapter, Rupert argues for eliminativism about subjective representation. He argues that all the data in the area, such as reflections on thought experiments, can be explained in terms of objective representation, where objective content “constitutes one component of a standard theoretical package that includes other constructs: conceptions, basic operations, and architectural structure” (180). In his view, the idea that the envatted brain’s experience represents an apple-looking thing is illusory. We are duped because, in having such an experience, the envatted brain employs the same vehicle that our brains employ when we have corresponding experiences—a vehicle that for us represents what it tracks, namely, apples. Opinions will differ on whether Rupert’s well-informed explication of that proposal succeeds in explaining away the intuition that the envatted brain’s experience, if subjectively indistinguishable from ours, is directed at apple-looking things (169).

Part V, on the importance of consciousness, includes what might be the book’s most fascinating exchange, between Charles Siewert and Geoffrey Lee. Siewert argues that consciousness has great epistemic, ontological, and ethical significance. Epistemic: consciousness provides distinctive warrant to both perceptual and introspective judgments. Ontological: “without consciousness nothing would mean anything to us, and we would . . . be literally mindless” (214). Ethical: “consciousness . . . lies at the heart of our concern for ourselves and for others” (199). He argues for those conclusions on intuitive grounds, without invoking specific epistemic, ontological, or ethical theories.

Lee acknowledges that Siewert’s arguments have intuitive force but presents an argument he takes to threaten (at least) the epistemic ones. If consciousness has unique epistemic significance then, Lee argues, there would have to be “a deep natural divide between beings that have consciousness and beings that lack it” (222). But, he maintains, the existence of such a divide is incompatible with reductive materialism, which he describes as “the view that consciousness is identical to a high-level functional or physical property of the brain or some larger system” (228). It follows that consciousness lacks unique epistemic significance if reductive materialism is true.

Lee takes that conditional conclusion to threaten Siewert’s arguments because they “do not seem to depend on rejecting reductive materialism” (223). It is true that they do not seem to so depend. But they might anyway, if natural and epistemic significance are as closely linked as Lee argues they are. Reductive materialism would in that case entail that the objective (third-person) perspective, not the subjective (first-person) perspective, is privileged for assessing the epistemic significance of consciousness. And Siewert’s reasoning appears to require rejecting the idea that the objective perspective has such priority—a move he seems more than willing to make (217).  It may even be possible for him to accept Lee’s conditional conclusion and apply modus tollens, arguing from the epistemic significance of consciousness to the falsity of physicalism.

I see no grand theme unifying the five parts of Current Controversies. That is not a deficiency. Rather, the disunity reflects the considerable diversity of topics in contemporary philosophy of mind. Ours is an exciting time for this sub-discipline, and this book provides a window into why.


Alter, T. n. d. The structure and dynamics argument.

Alter, T., and Nagasawa, Y. (eds). Forthcoming. Consciousness in the Physical World: Perspectives on Russellian Monism. New York: Oxford University Press.

Bhalla, M., and Proffitt, D. 1999. Visual-motor recalibration in the visual slant perception. Journal of Experimental Psychology: Human Perception and Performance 25: 1076-96.

Chalmers, D. J. 2012. Constructing the World. New York: Oxford University Press.

Chalmers, D. J. 2004. The representational character of experience. In B. Leiter (ed) The Future for Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon: 153–81.

Chalmers, D. J. 2003. Consciousness and its place in nature. In S. Stich and T. Warfield (eds.) The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge: Blackwell: 102-142.

Chalmers, D. J. 1997. Moving forward on the problem of consciousness. Journal of Consciousness Studies 4: 3-46.

Chalmers, D. J. 1995. Facing up to the problem of consciousness. Journal of Consciousness Studies 2: 200-19.

Clark, A. 1999. An embodied cognitive science. Trends in Cognitive Sciences 3: 345-51.

Goldman, A. 2012. A moderate approach to embodied cognitive science. The Review of Philosophy and Psychology 3: 71-88.

Gray, R. 2010. An argument for nonreductive representationalism. American Philosophical Quarterly 47: 365-376.

Harman, G. 1990. The intrinsic quality of experience. In J. Tomberlin (ed) Philosophical Perspectives 4: Action Theory and Philosophy of Mind, Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview: 31–52.

Howell, R. J. Forthcoming. The Russellian monist’s problems with mental causation.

Jackson, F. 1982. Epiphenomenal Qualia. Philosophical Quarterly 32: 127-36.

Nagel, T. 1986. The View from Nowhere. New York: Oxford University Press.

Lewis, D. 2009. Ramseyan humility. In D. Braddon-Mitchell and R. Nola (eds) Conceptual Analysis and Philosophical Naturalism, Cambridge: MIT Press: 203-22.

Putnam, H. 1981. Reason, Truth, and History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Stoljar, D. Forthcoming. Russellian Monism or Nagelian Monism? In Alter and Nagasawa forthcoming.

[1] For critical assessment of this claim, see Alter and Nagasawa forthcoming and Howell forthcoming.

[2] Elsewhere (Alter n. d.) I argue that it does not.

[3] Stoljar concedes this point (36). In a more recent piece (Stoljar forthcoming), he calls the view he favors Nagelian monism (in reference to Nagel 1986) and contrasts it with Russellian monism.

[4] For the hard/easy problem distinction, see Chalmers 1995.