Current Controversies in Philosophy of Religion

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Paul Draper (ed.), Current Controversies in Philosophy of Religion, Routledge, 2019, 191pp., $155.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138183469.

Reviewed by Allison Krile Thornton, University of South Alabama


In this book, editor Paul Draper defends a new vision for philosophy of religion and brings together nine essays he takes to embody it. Although philosophers of religion will find several contributions familiar, some, like Draper's on panpsychotheism, are quite novel.

The text is divided into four parts. Like all volumes in the Current Controversies series, each includes a pair of related essays along with an annotated bibliography of suggested further reading, and the book closes with a supplemental guide to further controversies in philosophy of religion. This structure is helpful and contributes to the usefulness and teachability of the text.

Draper opens the collection with a vision for philosophy of religion: that it broaden its focus by paying more attention to non-Western religions and to philosophical issues that concern religion in general (like how religion might make progress, or the philosophical significance of the diversity of religions); that it distance itself from theology (or at least reform its now-too-intimate relationship with special revelation); that its practitioners become more knowledgeable about religion in general or specific religions in the way that philosophers of science are often knowledgable about science in general or specific sciences; and that philosophers of religion correct the discipline's history of one-sided inquiry by "making a serious effort to spend some of their time constructing arguments and developing positions that contribute to the development, understanding, or defense of a worldview that those philosophers do not themselves hold" (p. 5).

Broadly speaking, Draper's aim is to free the discipline from various forms of narrowmindedness. There are general questions proper to the field -- we might take the titles of the sections to suggest four of them -- which the specifics of particular religions muddy our engagement with. Religious adherence is especially problematic for Draper, and he notes its connection to several of the discipline's problems, like its one-sided inquiry and improper appeals to special revelation. Thus, his corrective emphasizes the "inherently radical" roots of philosophy (which, in his view, "at its best . . . challenges authority, tradition, and the whole idea of dogma") and favors academic study over practice.

However, the degree to which religious practice and particularity are relevant to the study of philosophy of religion is itself a philosophical question. For example, Anne Jeffrey (God and Morality. Cambridge University Press. 2019) has recently argued in the context of metaethics that it's a mistake to focus on the implications of "thin" theisms because whether theism makes any difference (and what difference it makes) to questions in metaethics depends largely on the specific divine attributes that individuate specific theisms. This point may hold more generally in philosophy of religion. Answering questions about the nature of religious progress or the plausibility of an afterlife, for example, may require appeals to the details that individuate particular religions. Even in philosophy of science, which Draper suggests as a model for philosophy of religion, many argue that the field's most general questions, like "What is a causal relation?", may not have answers outside of specific sciences. Moreover, because it's possible that there is a god that can be primarily known through relationship or practice, practice seems relevant in philosophy of religion in a way that it might not be in other fields.

Nevertheless, Draper's vision is bold and cannot be addressed in a single book. The contributions to the present volume are united under the banner of Draper's first goal for the field: that it pay more attention to philosophical issues that concern religion-in-general. Thus, this collection steers clear of Biblical or historical analysis. In that sense, it's a refreshing option among edited collections in philosophy of religion. It would serve a graduate seminar in philosophy of religion well, for example, without requiring the students to have a degree of interest or background knowledge that only Christians are likely to have. On the other hand, the authors do not engage non-Christian religions in any substantive way or employ methodologies beyond those of analytic philosophy, and so the text is not ideal if you are looking for engagement with a diversity of religious traditions or philosophical approaches.

Section 1: Religious Progress

J. L. Schellenberg and Robert McKim open the volume with their contributions on future progress in religion. Schellenberg argues against "the common idea that we are already approaching, or have reached, the end of religious history" (p. 12). Two observations support his point. The first is about deep time: human life forms have been thinking about religion for a very short time in the grand scheme of things, especially relative to the length of time we likely have to go as a species. Schellenberg's second observation is about our various "developmental issues" (p. 17) evidenced by our intellectual and moral vices and the fact that our universities are only now beginning to institute women's studies, black studies, and peace studies programs. Religion is particularly problematic since it tends to be ideological, culturally prejudiced, parochial, and unimaginative (p. 18). Because overconfidence in ourselves and how far we've come religiously seems to be stalling more significant developments, Schellenberg's first step towards religious progress is that we recognize our immaturity.

McKim fleshes out the notion of religious progress more fully than Schellenberg. While Schellenberg measures religious progress against the goal of "fully tapping human transcendent aspirations" (p. 12), McKim considers two goals: achieving a deeper understanding of the truth and satisfying various practical needs (by providing, for example, guidance about how to live and how to cope with tragedy). Practical progress, McKim notes, may have impeded progress in understanding, since people tend to hold tight to familiar, helpful views. McKim also distinguishes between human and nonhuman religious progress. These types of progress may look very different since nonhumans, including descendants of some current forms of life, may have a capacity for religious awareness and insights (along with concerns or problems) that we do not have. Echoing a theme that shows up in both Mark C. Murphy's and Tim Mulgan's contributions, McKim suggests that recognizing the difference between human and nonhuman religious progress is important since "granting the human good such a central role in our idea of what is religiously ultimate is a sign of the very immaturity that, in Schellenberg's view, has impeded our development" (p. 40).

Section 2: Life After Death

Despite the title, the controversy in this section is not about whether life after death is possible -- both contributors agree that it is -- but focuses instead on the ontology of persons. In "Is Hope for Another Life Rational?" Mark Johnston argues for the affirmative given his account of human nature according to which each of us is a rational will ontologically distinct from the particular stuff that constitutes it -- "an individual essence-cum-its-embodiments" (p. 59). He arrives at this view by reductio: if we weren't individual essences-cum-their-embodiments, we'd be spatiotemporally surrounded by personites, things just like us but with different conditions of persistence. The existence of personites is morally and practically problematic. If they existed, for example, they'd share our moral status (since they would be intrinsically just like us) and we would be incapable of acting without harming them. But surely we are capable of acting without harming countless beings with moral status. Therefore, we can't be animals or four-dimensional objects or any of the other things that raise the problem of personites. (At least, we are practically required to believe we can't be any of those things.) Rather, we've got to be rational wills capable of embodiment but tied to no specific form of it. And if that's right, then we can have multiple embodiments, and so hope for another life is rational.

While Dean Zimmerman agrees with Johnston that hope for another life is rational -- in fact, he argues that an afterlife is consistent with every account of the human person -- he pushes back on Johnston's reductio. In particular, he defends an alternative to Johnston's account, animalism, on which the problem of personites does not arise. While Zimmerman grants that animalism implies that there are things that may seem like personites (in particular, clouds of particles that, if animalism is true, make us up), he denies that they are true personites because they are not intrinsically just like us. Unlike us, for example, these clouds cannot feel pleasure and pain. Zimmerman also questions whether Johnston's own view of human nature avoids the problem of personites any better since the embodiments to which Johnston says we are attached seem to raise the problem, too.

Section 3: Divine Motivation and the Problem of Evil

Although the problem of evil has various formulations, all hinge on a picture of God's nature according to which God has both the motivation and power to do something about evil. The final five chapters call this picture into question. Murphy (in Section 3) Tim Mulgan (in Section 4) argue that God lacks the relevant motivation. Their respondents, Laura W. Ekstrom and Fiona Ellis respectively, argue that on the contrary, God is loving. Draper (in Section 4) defends a view on which God lacks the power.

Murphy argues that God is not morally perfect (by "morally perfect" he means "that the moral norms that apply to God and us are substantially the same" (p. 95)). Murphy's argument has two parts. First, he argues that the uncontroversial divine perfections (power, knowledge, rationality, and freedom) do not entail moral perfection. If they did, then there would be some set of moral norms that God has good reason to act on, but we know of no such norms. By contrast, humans have good reason to act according to some basic moral norms (e.g., to tend to others' well-being), whether that reason is based in self-interest (following Hobbes), unavoidable sympathy (following Hume), our natures (following Aristotle), or recognition of the equality of humans (following Kant). Murphy's second line of support for the claim that God is not morally perfect is that the uncontroversial divine perfections rule out moral perfection. If moral norms did apply to God, then they would restrict the actions available to God even if those actions were permitted by reason. But Murphy's view of divine freedom is that God's action cannot be restricted by anything other than the force the good reasons that apply to God. Therefore, God cannot be both perfectly free and perfectly moral.

In her response, Ekstrom notes that "Murphy's depiction of God is of an all-powerful, all-knowing rational calculator" (p. 117) and renders an opposing account. If God exists, she argues, he must be essentially compassionate, because as a perfect agent he would strive to be in relationship with us, and good relationships require trust and compassion. She therefore resists Murphy's limited view of freedom, suggesting instead that God's essential dispositions -- like compassion or love -- can restrict God's actions as legitimately as the force of good reasons. Additionally, she argues that even if God is not essentially compassionate, he still has requiring reasons to prevent setbacks to the well-being of rational (and perhaps other sentient) creatures. For example, persons have intrinsic value and therefore pro tanto ought to be treated in ways that promote their well-being. (Murphy questions whether theism is compatible with the view that created persons have intrinsic value, and doubts whether something's intrinsic value would give God a reason to promote its well-being anyway.) Another suggestion is based on a duty of care according to which any rational agent who intentionally creates a sentient being has a requiring reason to prevent that sentient being from suffering as far as that agent is able to.

Section 4: Alternative Conceptions of God

Mulgan, like Murphy, explores a conception of a personal God who is not subject to the moral norms that apply to us. He calls the view that such a God exists ananthropocentric theism and argues that it is at least as plausible as the more traditional benevolent theism. Ananthropocentric theism has, for example, all the explanatory power of benevolent theism. Moreover, ananthropocentric theism has an obvious advantage over benevolent theism when it comes to the problem of evil. For all its perks, however, Mulgan expresses some doubts about ananthropocentric theism. Not unlike Ekstrom in her reply to Murphy, he questions whether the creator can be both personal and uncaring towards us. In fact, Mulgan argues that once we give up the notion that the creator cares about us, we have no reason at all to think that the creator is personal. The grounds for believing in a personal creator in the first place are that we need a personal relationship with our creator and the creator cares about our needs. Mulgan therefore presents an alternative, formal axiarchism, according to which the universe exists simply because it is the best and not because some entity causes it to exist. Formal axiarchism faces an objection familiar to all optimalist views -- viz. that it must be false since this world clearly isn't the best -- but with the help of anthropocentricism, it has an answer on hand: this is the best world, but only according to non-human-centered values. Ultimately, Mulgan remains agnostic between ananthropocentric theism and ananthropocentric axiarchism. His final view, ananthropocentric purposivism, is neutral with respect to how the purpose of the universe operates, whether "through a personal God, an impersonal Platonic Form, or formal axiarchic requirements" (p. 143).

Ellis splits Mulgan's apparent dilemma between benevolent and ananthropocentric theism. The God with which Ellis is concerned "is a God of love, but there is a question of whether it merits description in personalist terms, and what such terms really amount to" (p. 156). She is sympathetic to Mulgan's resistance to benevolent theism, agreeing that "there is more to value than what we happen to think or feel" (p. 149) and adding that benevolent theism seems like "a children's religion" given its emphasis on God's interest in and plans for us (p. 154). But in rejecting benevolent theism, we need not therefore go as far as ananthropocentricism. To show why, Ellis defends expansive naturalism, according to which there are objective values and they are grounded in this world as opposed to some cosmic realm. She then develops a theistic version of expansive naturalism, considering that "just as it makes sense to say that nature is value-involving so, too, we can say that it is God-involving" (p. 152). This framework can accommodate the existence of a loving God and objective values that are pertinent to us while avoiding the pitfalls of benevolent theism, though she encourages us to "bear in mind that love is complex, and that it can be inscrutable" (p. 154).

In the final chapter, Draper proposes that there is exactly one mind or subject of consciousness, and it is immaterial, located in and coextensive with space, and divine. Draper calls the view "panpsychotheism" (all-minds-[are]-God-ism). On panpsychotheism, human beings and other organisms are immersed in this universal mind, and their nervous systems somehow make use of it, exploiting phenomenal consciousness for their own biological ends. The seemingly individual minds that result from this process are not independent of or proper parts of the one universal mind, but rather are identical with it. The universal mind is the subject of all conscious experience. Moreover, the mind, if it exists, is divine since it is ontologically fundamental, the source of all value, and capable of mitigating the problem of death (insofar as it -- the subject of our conscious experience -- can survive the destruction of the nervous systems that make use of it). Draper delineates some of panpsychotheism's philosophical and religious strengths. For an example on the philosophical front, panpsychotheism suggests a novel solution to the mind-body problem. On the religious front, pansychotheism has an advantage over other conceptions of God because it avoids commitment to creation ex nihilo and the existence of a supernatural being (commitments traditional theisms make) and can mitigate the problem of death (a problem pantheism faces).


Thanks to Meghan Page for comments on an earlier draft of this review and the participants of the Junior Workshop in Philosophy of Religion for helpful conversation.