Current Controversies in Virtue Theory

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Mark Alfano (ed.), Current Controversies in Virtue Theory, Routledge, 2015, 161pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415658218.

Reviewed by Rebecca L. Walker, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


In this book, Mark Alfano collects the perspectives of ten philosophers (including himself) on five questions in virtue theory: What is virtue? Does virtue contribute to flourishing? How are ethical and epistemic virtues related? How are virtues acquired? Can people be virtuous? The volume offers different and (to varying extents) competing perspectives on each general topic. The volume as a whole presents an interesting and helpful tour through various debates considered by Alfano to be on the cutting edge of virtue theory. By focusing on virtue theory rather than virtue ethics, the volume is able to expand its reach to issues in virtue epistemology as well as questions about virtue within deontological and utilitarian moral frameworks. Despite the different questions officially at play, the last four contributions address in some way the 'situationist' critique of virtue (and vice) based on empirical studies of behavior. Specifically, that the degree to which human behavior can be manipulated by morally (or epistemologically) irrelevant modifications of a subject's situation is inconsistent with usual theoretical doctrine about virtues and vices as traits of character.

In what follows, I will briefly discuss each debate as it occurs, homing in on particular exchanges that I found intriguing. First, however, two general remarks may be helpful for the reader. The first concerns the audience aim for the volume, which is somewhat unclear. As an introductory text useable in an undergraduate course the contributions by Nancy E. Snow and Heather Battaly, among others, are exemplary. They locate historical and philosophical trends that bear on their topic and address their issues in a way that does not rely on previous knowledge of virtue theory. At the other extreme, the contribution by Ernest Sosa, in his exchange with Jason Baehr, addresses his topic several levels into the debate and focuses initially on interpretive issues with less in the way of orienting examples and context. This exchange seems primarily of interest to those already engaged in the relevant ongoing debates within virtue epistemology. Second, the chapters vary significantly in the extent to which each author engages the views of the other chapter contributor. As the rationale for the volume relies on the fruitful nature of pairwise philosophical exchanges, it seems important to consider more intentionally the authors' particular modes of engagement.

What Is a Virtue? (Battaly and Liezl van Zyl)

In chapter 1, starting from the idea that "virtues are qualities that make one an excellent person," (p. 8) Battaly proposes that we embrace a broadly pluralistic view about what qualities count. She focuses specifically on debates over whether virtues must involve good ends (or effects), good motives, or both and welcomes all-comers within those various camps as offering legitimate proposals for "thickening" our thin concept of "human excellence." Importantly, her embrace also gathers in both voluntary and non-voluntary "qualities" that might count as human excellences, from honesty to good memory. Van Zyl opposes Battaly's brand of pluralism, finding it problematically radical in so far as accepting its truth would undermine the broader normative theories that various views of virtue fall under and, more worrisomely, defy laws of logic in promoting mutually exclusive claims. Van Zyl instead proposes that a virtue is "a character trait that involves acting from good a motive and reliably [in the typical case] producing good effects" (p. 28).

I am sympathetic with van Zyl's view of what counts as a virtue and with her worry about Battaly's view but for somewhat different reasons. There is a fairly straightforward reading of Battaly's claim that I think does not fall down to van Zyl's seemingly devastating critique. Battaly might be arguing not that any particular theory or individual should accept radically plural views about virtue (precisely because of constraints on good theorizing and coherence) but that each of these views is still a plausible and valid conception of virtue as a spelling out of the thin notion. Since she does not address (or mention) van Zyl's critique, it is hard to say whether she would accept this interpretation. What I am more worried about is a point that van Zyl passes by as a "trivial point of disagreement," (p. 24) namely whether natural capacities like memory or vision could be virtues. We surely can employ the notion of virtue to track qualities of persons other than character traits cultivated through active habituation, but once we do so we lose track of a whole set of really interesting debates regarding the role of choice in the initial and ongoing cultivation of virtue, the relationship between natural capacities and virtues (as traits of character), and whether the virtues must be unified (e.g. under practical -- or theoretical -- reason). While answers to these questions all have implications for Battaly and van Zyl's debate over the relationship of virtues to (roughly) good effects and good motives, they strike me as more promising and interesting routes of engagement in addressing the question "What is a virtue?"

Does Virtue Contribute to Flourishing? (Robert C. Roberts and Snow)

In this chapter, Roberts takes on one of the familiar topics for virtue ethics by addressing two related issues. First he argues against a "positive affective time slice" view of happiness and in favor of "person-happiness", which requires virtues and includes negative affect. Second he reviews deep and ongoing controversies over which traits are in fact virtues by focusing on compassion, obedience, and humility. He concludes that, as the question of what life form is "normatively characteristic" for us is "deeply contested" (p. 49) and depends on basic human nature and what kind of universe we live in (e.g. theistic or otherwise), even though it is the case that virtues contribute to human flourishing, people may not be the best judges of their own flourishing. In her reply (Roberts, like Battaly, does not mention the second chapter contributor's views so "reply" seems the appropriate term), Snow agrees, "Clearly, virtue does contribute to flourishing in deep and significant ways" (p. 49), but she worries about Robert's claim that people may not be able to judge whether or not they are flourishing. In making her point, she canvases philosophical and other cultural judgments of women and slaves (in the antebellum American South) "virtues" and "flourishing" by members of their oppressing classes as well as the (less heard) voices of women and slaves themselves. She argues, "The record examined here shows that at times, we have good reason to be cautious about claims that people aren't the best judges." (p. 50)

While Snow's own discussion draws attention to the perspectives of members of oppressed groups who rejected their oppressors' views of their good, there is a familiar philosophical problem about how to treat subjective perspectives on well being by those who have internalized their oppressors' narratives. Thus Snow's focus on oppressed classes could also be manipulated to argue in favor of Roberts' claim that individuals can't necessarily judge whether they are flourishing. I'd like to suggest instead that Snow's general point is best read as presenting a deeper concern for Roberts' argument. Roberts claims that which traits count as virtues is determined by the correct normative account of human nature and the condition of the universe in which we live. Such heady topics are, as Roberts notes, deeply contested. Snow's general line of critique may show, however, that interrogating various accounts of virtue may get more traction by taking a serious look at the historical, cultural, and social contexts (including our own) in which the proposals are vetted.

Further, in this line of critique I think Snow herself does not go far enough. In introducing her argument, Snow writes,

Today, it is primarily in virtue of his or her rational capacities that a person is thought capable of developing virtue and living a flourishing life. Men and women are regarded as equal in their rational capacities, and thus, as equally capable of having the same virtues and flourishing in roughly the same or similar ways. (p. 50)

I have two worries about this claim. First, it is patently clear that men and women are not generally "regarded as equal" in their rational capacities as any cross-cultural review of practices regarding girls' education and women's political and economic social integration should tell us. Second, more contentiously, Snow's review of the ways in which a focus on "rational capacities" was developed and deployed in philosophy might also give us pause about that very pride of place in our modern accounts of virtue.

Snow extends her critique of how we judge the flourishing of others by pointing to modern conceptions of children's virtues. She distances her critique of children's virtues from her concerns regarding oppression, in which mistakes regarding virtue and flourishing "were often not innocent errors, but worked to the advantage of those who made them and to the detriment of women and blacks." (p. 56) Arguing that the "idealized" traits of trusting, innocence and hope may in fact damage rather than help children, she urges us to "pay attention to empirical studies that inform us of the traits children actually use to function and live well. These traits are their virtues." (p. 59) Leaving aside the contentious issue of whether children actually have virtues in the proper sense at all, I would like to point out that it is not so clear that oppression isn't exactly what is at issue in our conception of children's virtues. To see this, we can recall the virtue of obedience that Roberts addressed as among a core set of contentious virtues. Roberts goes so far as to say that even those rejecting obedience as a virtue might still "admit that obedience is a "virtue" in children, but not a virtue in adults." (p. 47) Unlike the somewhat more facile virtues of trust, innocence, and hope, attending closely to the ways in which obedience has been wielded as an institutional and social tool in the oppression of children may feel too radical a critique. But perhaps that is precisely why we ought to consider it.

How Are Virtue and Knowledge Related? (Sosa and Baehr)

In a style of exchange significantly different than the paper-reply method deployed in the first two chapters Sosa and Baehr engage in debate over the correct interpretation and scope of reliablism and responsibilism in virtue epistemology, the role of intellectual character virtues in constituting knowledge, and the relationship between ethics and epistemology more broadly speaking. While the depth of exchange is refreshing, I did find the chapter overall less accessible than any of the others for the reasons noted above.

A significant amount of energy in the exchange between Sosa and Baehr is spent delineating and challenging boundaries both within epistemology and between epistemology and ethics. Sosa proposes a "charmed inner circle" (p. 69) circumscribing traditional epistemology as including intellectual virtues or competences that constitute some piece of knowledge but excluding virtues that merely enable knowledge (such as open-mindedness, intellectual courage, and persistence (ibid)). While he notes "epistemology is not a department of ethics" (p. 71), Sosa thinks that those enabling intellectual character virtues are still "of interest to a broader epistemology." (p. 69) Baehr, on the other hand, is interested in expanding Sosa's "charmed inner circle" of epistemology to include intellectual character virtues. He argues that these traits can also meet the requirement of constituting knowledge because their exercise "cannot be divorced from the operation of perceptual or other cognitive faculties like introspection and reason" (p. 82) that do constitute knowledge. For example, gaining a piece of visual knowledge is often not merely a matter of having good eyesight but also of having certain perceptual habits like attentiveness and carefulness. While it is easy to get distracted by their professional quibble over territory in epistemology, the more interesting (to my mind) matter at issue between Sosa and Baehr concerns these broader questions about how knowledge is constituted.

How Are Virtues Acquired? (Daniel C. Russell and Christian B. Miller) and Can People Be Virtuous? (Alfano and James Montmarquet)

While chapters 4 and 5 address somewhat different questions within virtue theory, I combine their discussion because each addresses, in some way, the 'situationist' critique of virtue. Russell and Miller are both concerned, in different ways, with whether and how our psychological make-up is consistent with acquiring virtue. Noting that "our philosophical vision of moral development must be bounded by constraints of psychological feasibility," (p. 105) Russell aims to defend the human capacity for acquiring virtues despite the "extensive experimental evidence suggesting that human behavior has less to do with responding to reasons than we suppose." (p. 92) To develop his position, Russell adopts a particular view of personality within psychology (the social-cognitive theory) and argues that this theory supports an account of skill acquisition as a "practical form of responsiveness to reasons" (p. 103) that can helpfully be utilized in arguing for human virtue acquisition. Miller is sympathetic with Russell's efforts but draws attention to a range of 'Surprising Dispositions' (p. 109) that he claims have been supported by "hundreds" of relevant psychology studies (p. 111) and which are incompatible with virtue -- because they promote either bad behaviors or good behaviors from non-virtuous movtives.  Examples include "Beliefs and desires concerned with harming others in order to maintain a positive opinion of myself" (p. 109) and "Desires concerned with helping when doing so will contribute toward extending my good mood" (p. 110). In short, Miller argues, Russell's account must not only explain how we can develop virtues that are responsive to reasons but also how we can combat these surprising (and unconscious) dispositions that tend to thwart the acquisition of virtues.

Alfano takes up the situationist challenge in a somewhat different manner by proposing a method ('Ramsification') for adjudicating the debate over "whether people can be virtuous." (p. 125) His application of this method, he argues, shows that we "face a theoretical tradeoff between . . . insisting that virtue is a robust property of an individual agent that's rarely attained and . . . allowing that one person's virtue might inhere partly in other people." (p. 125) Alfano supports the second option, though, as Montmarquet (p. 144) points out, it isn't entirely clear that this solution isn't either an appeal to a wholly uncontroversial point (that virtues require contextual support) or else is nonsensical (that a virtue, which belongs to a person, also inheres in others). Montmarquet, for his part, reveals a delightfully cranky disposition regarding the tendency of "enthusiasts, inside or outside of philosophy, who would apply the lessons of the new science to 'old moral thinking'" (p. 136) -- a tendency that is shared by the three other philosophers writing on the situationist challenge.

I have no particular contribution to make toward resolving the situationist challenge to virtues of character, however, I do want to make two points related to the debate as it shows up in this volume. First, I think we need to be a little more careful about what science "shows" by disentangling behavioral data from the more expansive conclusions and theories that accompany it. Science is, after all, also in the business of uncertainty and speculation. Miller, for example, moves much too quickly from reviewing some behavioral data to embracing -- altogether speculative -- "surprising [unconscious] dispositions" that are said to explain this data. Second, in heeding the lessons of the sciences relevant to virtue theory, the tendency in philosophy to make a beeline to psychology deserves comment. While it is understandable that philosophers should see psychology's investigation of personality as relevant to character, it makes as much sense to deepen our understanding of character by looking to cultural studies of value transmission, the various histories of character education, and the ways in which political and economic structures condition individual and social character.

Overall, this volume offers a useful contribution to important debates within virtue theory. It would have been improved by a clearer pitch to a particular audience level within philosophy and by a more directive editorial hand in structuring the method of engagement between the chapter contributors. The questions addressed are important but not always as well formulated as they should be (it is much less controversial, for example, that virtue contributes to flourishing than that it is necessary for happiness or constitutes flourishing). To my mind there is too much about the situationist challenge and too little about related issues regarding the social enactment of virtue (for example whether virtues can be relative to social roles or cultural context). The authors make important contributions but sometimes miss obvious critiques or responses (in some cases that their intended interlocutors might have offered had they engaged with them). Despite Alfano's generous comment in the acknowledgments that the contributors and press made the process "a breeze," (ix) putting together an edited volume is no small task. Alfano is to be congratulated on delivering an engaging volume on an interesting set of topics within virtue theory, although leaning into the wind a bit more might have yielded some improvements.