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William Desmond, Cynics, Acumen, 2008, 290pp, $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780520258617.

Reviewed by John Moles, Newcastle University



To write a compendium to the Cynics covering their history from the 4th century BCE to the 6th century CE and their huge and diverse influence from their beginnings down the ages to the present day is an unspeakable task. It requires competence over a vast time span, over many different periods and cultures, over not only philosophy but also history, politics, literature, religion (Jewish and Christian as well as pagan), and art, and it includes major Classical writers (Horace, Petronius, Lucian) and major European philosophers (Rousseau, Nietzsche). It also requires considerable discrimination in the use of the ancient evidence, extremely lacunose and varied as it is. Add the prospectus of this series, Ancient Philosophies: ‘fresh and engaging introductions to the major schools of philosophy of antiquity . . . clear and rigorous presentations of core ideas … for students of philosophy and classics’, to almost all of whom almost of all of this material will be new. Hence a need for a deft mixture of primary material and context or background, of basic information and critical analysis.

Desmond, well-informed author of the well-received The Greek Praise of Poverty: Origins of Ancient Cynicism (2006) (, writes, indeed, freshly and engagingly, and his wide stylistic range includes colloquialisms, jokes and nice turns.

The glossaries, bibliography, index and the wide-ranging and detailed ‘guide to further reading’ are excellent, the last of value to specialists as well as beginners. The basic organization is coherent (if problematic in some respects). The overall movement is chronological: chapter 1 provides potted introductions to the main Cynics and others more or less influenced by Cynicism, while chapters 2-6 treat major themes and concerns, with recurrent movements from negative to positive.

Shortcomings include constant documentary overload; much disproportion, repetitiveness and overlapping; some self-contradiction; insufficient referencing and cross-referencing; a rather capricious relationship between text, notes within the text, endnotes and ‘further reading’; unexplained or over-allusive allusions; some disconcerting Latin and English solecisms, and some very old-fashioned historical perspectives (which I do not illustrate but which will disturb historians). The book is too long for its contents; disciplined pruning would have allowed much additional matter. Desmond’s readers should have been more stringent.

The introduction takes the Diogenes of the encounter with Alexander as representative, summarizes his thinking and behavior as well as different ancient reactions, distinguishes between ancient Cynicism and modern cynicism, outlines positive modern verdicts on the former, distinguishes between different types of cynicism, and signals the main sources. The exposition is over-long (e.g. on modern cynicism [2-3]), too allusive (the largely unexplained ‘most important sources’ [5-6] would baffle most students), and careless in expression (‘various dialogues of Lucian, especially the Cynicus once (erroneously) attributed to him’ 5). The historicity of the encounter (well defended by Hammond, Sources for Alexander the Great 1993 28) seems to be accepted (7), but without rigor. Yet the question is important on many levels: Diogenes’ attitude to worldly rulers; his practical response to them; his frankness, bravery and culture of nature; Alexander’s knowledge of contemporary philosophers; and Onesicritus’ portrayal of Diogenes and of Diogenes’ role in his portrayal of Alexander.

Desmond never faces up to these kinds of historical questions, which affect assessment alike of the substantiality, impact and reception of Cynicism. Introductions may perhaps legitimately flag arguable conclusions, though in the case of such a controversial topic as Cynicism an initial tabula rasa would in my view have been the better course. At any rate, here already, unequivocally, Cynicism is a ‘philosophy’, ‘Diogenes … the first … “dog” ’(5), Cynics were not ’mere shameless “dogs” ’ (4), but ’astonishingly optimistic regarding human nature’ (3), and ‘Cynicism … was both a single outlook and extraordinarily varied’ (5) (hence the usual sub-divisions, used with scare quotes, ‘hard’, ‘soft’, ‘literary’, etc.). While Desmond subsequently produces piece-meal arguments for most of these claims, which (in my view) are more or less correct (although I believe that, like others, he exaggerates Cynicism’s ‘extraordinary variety’), he never confronts the single biggest question about Cynicism (already in ancient tradition, explicitly at D.L. 6.103, and still debated): whether it qualifies as a philosophy in any sense rather than just a way of life. While the two can cohere, ‘right living’ being the goal of ancient philosophy generally (Macleod, JRS 69 1979 16-27), such ‘living’ requires some underlying thinking. That Cynicism had some such thinking is most easily (though not solely) demonstrable through reconstruction of important Cynic texts, written, as they were, in serio-comic style. Desmond, naturally familiar with such source criticism (263), never pursues it, convincing though some of it is (though he occasionally reconstructs chains of thought [e.g. 157]).

Hence much blurring of different categories of evidence and a major structural problem for the book: the exposition of ancient Cynicism ends with Cynic cosmopolitanism, for which the key text is Diogenes’ Politeia, reconstructible from D.L. 6.72 (as Desmond seems to concede 186). That work, however, should come at the beginning, because it is also key for understanding all Diogenic Cynicism and of most of its developments and modifications. Failure to acknowledge such basic material produces further confusions: between the questions of the uniformity of Cynicism over the ages and of the unity of Diogenic Cynicism (6-7; 245 n. 1); and concerning that very unity (formally different values [245 n. 1] belong within a single coherent ‘package’). It also inhibits clarification of Cynicism’s overall logic, which combines ‘thought’ (necessarily, given other Cynic assumptions, minimalist) with ‘performance’ or ‘what works’, the latter both as a verifiable solution for oneself and as a demonstration for others. Further, especially given the prospectus, consideration should have been given to the question of whether Cynicism qualifies as a ‘school’ (answer: yes and no). Finally, the question of vulgarization and bowdlerization of the record should have been trailed: Höistad held that the image of the historical Diogenes was grossly vulgarised, and, though the claim is untenable, it merits notice as that of a major Cynic scholar; conversely, bowdlerization and idealization of the historical Cynics is a persistent trend in the tradition (as, again, Desmond knows [75, 268] but generally underplays).

The very useful first chapter begins with a historical survey of Greece, Macedon and Rome, distinguishes between proto-Cynics (legendary, from other cultures, Socrates), 4th century ‘canonical’ figures, Hellenistic ‘literary’ Cynics, and the eclectic Roman period, down to the Christian Fathers.

Some comments on details in Chapter 1:

While Desmond rightly stresses the schizophrenic appearance of Antisthenes’ thought, ‘the ancient tradition’ that ‘Antisthenes was the first Cynic’, though dominant, is not ‘unanimous’ (13). Antisthenes’ obvious influence on Diogenes does not require a ‘personal link’, to which the powerful objections, as Desmond does not say, are chronological. Antisthenes’ strong continuing presence within the Cynic tradition (greater than recognized at 18, 157) is noteworthy: see Brancacci in Swain (ed.), Dio Chrysostom: Politics, Letters, and Philosophy (2000), 240-60; Moles, JHS 125 (2005) 112-38 (on Dio 13).

D.L. 6.71 shows that the motto ‘deface the currency’ was adopted not just by ‘later Cynics’ (20) but by Diogenes himself. Desmond here (20) takes Aristotle’s ‘dog’ (Rhet. 1411a24) as Diogenes, whereas 246 n. 10 favours Antisthenes (so M.-O. Goulet-Cazé). On the question of Diogenes’ writings, Desmond begins (22): ‘other rumours impute various writings to Diogenes’ and concludes: ‘perfect precision about Diogenes’ sayings, writings, movements and life is not attainable. What is more important … is the personality of the man’ (as if this could be established independently?). On the question of Diogenes’ (fictitious) enslavement: ‘it may well be the case that as an exile Diogenes was enslaved at some point’ (22). Such evasions frustrate scholarly progress. As for Hipparchia, ‘later denigrators sneered that [Crates and Hipparchia] had sex in public’ (27). In fact, this well-attested ‘dog marriage’ perfectly enacts Diogenic sexology, as long ago demonstrated by Rist, Stoic Philosophy (1969) 61 ff. (which Desmond knows 271).

Onesicritus’s Alexander history was not formally a ‘biography’ (30). Desmond’s discussion of Onesicritus’ account of his visit to the Gymnosophists is under-developed, nor does he register the sheer chutzpah of Onesicritus’ ‘cynicisation’ of Alexander (on both: Moles in Laks and Schofield, Justice and Generosity (1995) 144 ff.). Bion’s ‘biography’ is obviously partly based on Diogenes’ ‘biography’ (OCD³, 243). The discussion of diatribe is rather generalized and could have been improved by consultation of OCD³, 463; undoubtedly, Bion (and Zeno) wrote works with that title, and Horace represents his Satires as belonging to the ‘Bionian’, ‘Cynic’ and ‘serio-comic’ ‘genre’ of ‘diatribe’ (Epistles 2.2.60; Satires 1.1.13-14).

As Cynic, politician and law-maker, Cercidas (35) deserves fuller treatment, especially as fairly substantial fragments survive. Desmond’s discussion of Oenomaus does not register his clear philosophical and literary imitation of Diogenes (a further consequence of failure to engage with the question of Diogenes’ writings), as demonstrated by Hammerstädt, whom Desmond references. Demetrius was hardly ‘the first “true” Cynic after a hiatus of some two hundred years’ (50); see Moles, JHS 103 (1983) 120 ff.

Dio Chrysostom did not criticize his friend Titus ‘for having a homosexual relationship with a boxer’ (57): Orr. 28 and 29 are encomiastic. Characteristically, neither here nor elsewhere, does Desmond commit himself on — still less, argue out — the key question of whether Dio spoke the Kingships to Trajan. On Dio 13, a major (partly) Cynic text, see Moles, JHS 125 (2005) 112 ff. Desmond’s general emphasis on the importance of Cynicism to the Stoic Epictetus (59), as against scholars such as Brunt and Long, seems to me correct and important, though space should somewhere have been found for full treatment of 3.22, another key text on Cynicism, powerfully analyzed by Schofield, Philosophical Quarterly 54 (2004) 448 ff. (unreferenced).

Desmond’s extended analyses of Lucian, here (55-6, 60-7) as elsewhere, are a major strength of the book. Lucian’s ‘digging-up’ of ‘Bion’ (61; Bis. Acc. 33) alludes to ‘philosophical and literary reincarnation’ (e.g. Woodman in A.J. Woodman and D. Feeney [eds], Traditions and Contexts in the Poetry of Horace 2002, 53 ff.) and to Bion’s punning both on his own name as ‘life’ (Moles in S. Harrison, The Cambridge Companion to Horace 2007 178) and on the Cynic ‘way of life’. Desmond (67-9) ignores Clay’s disturbing (but, I think, untenable) claim (ANRW II.36.5, 3425) that Lucian invented Demonax.

Chapter 2 is also very useful (though too long), and considers the topic under various headings (clothing, housing, diet, etc).

Some comments on details in Chapter 2:

The tentative treatments of Diogenes and cannibalism (86) and the community of children/women/men (95, cf. also 257 n. 10) are further casualties of Desmond’s abjuration of source criticism. The ‘sex’ section (89) also needs Diogenes’ Politeia, also the source of Diogenes’ ‘mischievous syllogism’ (103; D.L. 6.37; 72).

The interesting discussion of Cynic views on slavery could use Brunt, ‘Aspects of the Social Thought of Dio Chrysostom and of the Stoics’, PCPS 19 (1973) 1 ff.

Unfashionably (but, I think, rightly), Desmond follows Rostovtzeff and Baldwin in discerning real social protest in the Cynicising Lucian (100).

To my mind, Desmond (101 and elsewhere) over-emphasizes Cynic ‘opportunism’. The motto ‘use the things that are present’ (both spatially and temporally) allows a certain (small) moral relativism, then greatly developed by Bion under Aristippus’ influence (cf. OCD³, 243; Horace, Epistles 1.17, reads this aright).

The wide-ranging discussion of Cynic ‘language’, including gesture (122 ff.), might also consider: (a) Bosman’s ‘Selling Cynicism: the Pragmatics of Diogenes’ Comic Performances’, CQ 56 (2006) 93 ff.; (b) the likely influence of Antisthenes (cf. 18, 157, 255 n. 53); © the fact (pace 123) that some of Diogenes’ jokes play, precisely, on the ‘instability of the sign’, hence, presumably, further incentive towards a philosophy of ‘what works’.

In chapter 3, necessary background (different conceptions of nature; other philosophers’ interpretation of the motto; anticipations of Cynic thinking) becomes foreground and for far too long, though useful points emerge (e.g. similarities with the Epicurean ‘life according to nature’ 147), as, eventually, does the right conclusion: Cynics interpreted the motto primitivistically (160-1; 257 n. 10). Fifty years ago, simple quellenkritik (Brown, Onesicritus 1949 149 n. 152) proved Diogenes’ imprimatur here.

The same criticism applies to chapter 4, although, again, there are interesting things. Following Relihan, Desmond interprets Petronius’ Menippean Satyricon as a Cynic novel, whose Cena dramatizes reversals of Fortune, from which the Cynic-like wanderers Ascyltus and Encolpius escape (169-71). This interesting and coherent interpretation (again) harnesses Cynicism to serious social criticism, although Petronian scholars seem unimpressed. The comparison of the self to an actor is first attributed not to Bion (181) but to Aristippus (D.L. 2.66, cf. Horace, Epistles 1.1.19; 17.23-4). Its great importance to the Stoic Panaetius (Cic. Off. 1.107 ff.) should be signaled.

Chapter 6 finally tackles Diogenes’ Politeia, which (pace 186) is perfectly compatible with Crates’ Pera. Cercidas should have appeared here. Desmond makes interesting observations about the Cynics’ ‘democratic populism’ (188-92). On the other hand, philosophical kingship theory is not unproblematically Cynic (196), as Desmond later admits (199); see also on Onesicritus above. For the rest, Desmond’s discussion of Cynic cosmopolitanism, giving it great positive value, largely follows positions I myself have maintained. One false note is the claim that Epicureans were not missionary philosophers (203).

Chapter 6 is inevitably a highly selective gallop, with individual stops, from Stoicism to Sloterdijk, and, finally, Navia, both of whom argue for the value, even the necessity, of Cynic thinking in today’s world, thereby ending the book on an uplifting note. Many of the gaps are plugged in the ‘further reading’; see also now L. Shea, The Cynic Enlightenment: Diogenes in the Salon (2010).

Some comments on details in Chapter 6:

Desmond rightly stresses that later Stoics generally retreated from Chrysippean intellectualism to an ethical core exemplified by an idealised Cynicism (211), though he omits Panaetian hostility and Seneca’s interesting ambivalences.

Although 246 references Gigante’s Cinismo e Epicureismo, I would have liked consideration of the superficially more surprising Cynic influence on the Epicureans, which seems to me considerable, despite the fact that Epicureans, from Epicurus on, reviled the Cynics, presumably on the principle of ‘that man did me a good turn ten years ago and I’ve hated him ever since’.

The pages on claimed relationships between Cynicism and early Christianity should have ‘main-texted’ diatribe and Cynic influence on Paul (convincingly expounded by Malherbe, referenced on 272). The discussion of the ‘Cynic Jesus’ controversy balances arguments conscientiously, before tilting to the negative. Like most such discussions, however, it envisages only two possibilities: Jesus the complete Cynic or a Jesus wholly untouched by Cynicism, whereas the case for some influence has, I believe, some good arguments. The long discussion of later Christians’ ambivalence to Cynics culminates with LeontiusLife of Symeon (7th century), where Desmond is unduly noncommittal about Krueger’s claim of a systematic analogy with an unreconstructed Diogenes: remarkable final proof of the longevity and canonicity of Diogenic Cynicism.

Criticisms allowed for, this book remains a considerable achievement. It unites rare diligence with unobtrusive intelligence and independence of judgment. Its coverage is immense. Anyone who works on Cynicism at any level will find it extremely useful.

See also Scott Rubarth’s review at