Dancing with Iris: The Philosophy of Iris Marion Young

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Ann Ferguson and Mechthild Nagel (eds.), Dancing with Iris: The Philosophy of Iris Marion Young, Oxford University Press, 2009, 268pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195389111.

Reviewed by Falguni A. Sheth, Hampshire College


This collection of 18 essays is an intellectual tribute to the presence and thought of Iris Marion Young, a philosopher who wrote across a broad spectrum of topics. Young, who died in July 2006, wrote notably about feminist phenomenology, ethics and social justice, democratic theory, global justice and security. The essays, divided into five sections, engage with and challenge the full range of Young's work in philosophy. They reflect the editors' multifaceted relationship to Young and her work. Since it is not possible to review all eighteen essays, I will discuss a selection of themes and essays from each section.

The first section, Homage to Iris Marion Young, is a moving tribute to Young, the philosopher, the feminist, and the friend. In the introduction, Ann Ferguson and Mechthild Nagel provide a brief summary of Young's work, including her contributions to political philosophy, feminist theory, phenomenology, state power, ethics, and democracy. The section concludes with a long and intimate farewell letter to Young by her friend and colleague, Karsten J. Struhl.

In between these two is a brief but substantial interview conducted by Vlasta Jalušič and Mojca Pajnik during Young's visit to Slovenia en route to Prague. During that interview, Young discussed her understanding of the meaning of gender (which she divides into academic and the political [25]), as well as its relationship to democracy, feminism, and political theory. Gender, for Young, is a specialized term, which has a certain function of "describing relationships across issues of sexual division of labor, sexuality, and intimacy, and care relationships" (26). Young traces the substance of gender back to the distinction between sex (as embodiment) and the cultural (gender), which emerges from discussions between Toril Moi and Judith Butler. For Young, the salience of gender is found in retaining its link to social structures. Even though much of the interview is spent discussing gender, the category -- even through Young's explanations -- becomes no clearer than her engagement with it in Throwing Like a Girl. In the interview Young also touches on democracy, European identity, and power in relation to Bonnie Honig, Seyla Benhabib, Will Kymlicka, and Jürgen Habermas, among others. Her debate with Habermas and other European theorists is about the hegemonic position of the United States in contemporary geopolitics, and Habermas' advocacy for Europe to take a stronger position to serve as a counterbalance to the hegemony of the United States in relation to the invasion of Iraq. Young agrees with the direction that Habermas endorses but correctly challenges the Eurocentrism of this position, his valorizing Europe's "cosmopolitanism" at the expense of the recognition of nations outside of Europe and North America -- many of which have played important roles in various social movements.

The next section, on Embodiment, Phenomenology, and Gender," is composed of essays by Sandra Lee Bartky, Michaele Ferguson, Susan Leigh Foster, and Bonnie Mann. Mann and Bartky both suggest that Young's work on feminist phenomenology was perhaps among the most accessible, and consequently, some of the most widely known parts of her work, even though she was irritated to be so intimately tied to this topic. Young's dissatisfaction concerned her negative view of her work on phenomenology, namely that it constucts women as victimized (Bartky, 49) and that it closed off, rather than opened, certain feminist questions (Mann, 79). And yet, as the writers in this section argue, it did anything but close off or treat women as victims.

In many ways Young revolutionized how women thought about their physical comportments, stances, and relationships to the physical world. This section reflects the wide-ranging intellectual fascination that her writings on breastfeeding, pregnancy, menstruation, and "gendered" comportment provoked. Through the application of phenomenology to various facets of women's existence, Young facilitated a productive space in which to consider the, political and sociological dimensions of sex and gender. What's more, as Bartky comments, by enabling a candid phenomenological conversation through the association of, for example, breastfeeding, intimacy, and pleasure, Young brought these aspects into conversation with each other, and removed the forced dichotomy between motherhood and sexuality, allowing the possibility of recognizing the (now obvious) links between them.

Mann points to the ways in which Young's insights about female comportment in "Throwing Like a Girl," resonate with herself as a mother, watching the ways in which the young girls on a soccer team, at such an early age, engage so indecisively and hesitantly with each other and the ball. If anything, Young's writing allows feminist scholars to use her observations and arguments as a springboard to open up the space for feminist inquiry. As Foster reports in her essay, Young's writings had an impact in areas beyond feminist and philosophical scholarship: "Young's theorization of a feminine physicality … provided a strong foundation for emerging studies in performance and corporeality." (69) Mann suggests that Young's writings can also have an impact in psychoanalysis, through the politicization of the work of Jacques Lacan, whose theoretical commitments understand gender as a feature of identity that emerges after the initial relationship between the inner and "surrounding world." (88). Mann argues that Young's writings point to gender as a central feature in the formation of identity, such that

a feminist account will … recogniz[e] that the singular image the baby confronts in the mirror will be followed over the course of a lifetime by millions of images. They will confront the subject in the marketplace; in the eyes of those she respects, despises, or loves; in the claims made on her by her womanhood, her race, her class, and her nation; in the situations carved out for her by structural injustice. (89)

Mann links this moving passage to the ways in which phenomenologists will link this recognition to the style and singularity of a subject, for whom style and outward appearances reflect the internal self-recognition of any subject.

Even feminist scholars, like Michaele Ferguson, who are explicit about their discomfort with Young's use of personal narratives in her phenomenological and other political writings are moved to try to explore that discomfort in constructive ways. As Ferguson points out, there are multiple reasons for that discomfort -- from the stark way in which Young isolated her narratives, allowing them to stand as an argument in themselves and allowing the reader to attempt to reconcile them with the associated writings, which are more detached and abstract. Ferguson concludes that part of the discomfort might be the impetus to do more than philosophical analysis, but to act constructively in the face of injustice.

The third section, Theorizing the State: Method, Violence and Resistance, consists of essays by Alison Jaggar, Bat-Ami Bar On, and Margaret Denike which draw on Young's various writings on justice, power, and state theory to explore Young's critical methodology, her approach to the question of intervention, and her reflections on American society in the post-9/11 world. Jaggar contrasts Young's critical theoretical approach with John Rawls' ideal theory framework by pointing to several ways in which they diverge. First, whereas Rawls' approach aims at a set of principles for an ideal and just society, Young uses a critical evaluative method that reflects and grapples with normative concepts. Second, Young also draws on actual historical examples whereas Rawls engages in an "imaginary reasoning process involving imaginary reasoners in an imaginary situation." (98) Finally, Young attempts to deal with structural injustice and "cultural exclusion," while Rawls does not. Although Jaggar does not give contrasting examples about Rawls' approach, I would guess that she might point to the absence of incorporating racial, gendered, or class inequalities into his framework, such as those that emerge from historical artifacts such as slavery.

While I generally agree with Jaggar's argument concerning the contrast between Young's and Rawls' approaches, I'm not sure that there is not more to be desired from Young's approach to (in)justice. It is certainly the case that Young's approach to the "Five Faces of Oppression," for example, artfully points to various facets of injustice, namely: exploitation, marginalization, powerlessness, cultural imperialism, and violence.[1] Each of these is often intertwined with several of the other four categories that she analyzes. She distinguishes each via certain salient characteristics: exploitation has to do with the class division or a "steady process of the transfer of the results of the labor of one social group to benefit another" (49); marginalization is the system of excluding a class of people from useful participation in social/material life (53); powerlessness stems from the lack of authority or power to make decisions in regard to policy, personal or workplace autonomy, personal development and skills, and in relation to others (56); cultural imperialism is defined as the popular hegemony of a group's experience as the paradigm experience of all other groups (59); and finally, violence which, strangely enough, is not defined but rather instantiated through examples of rape and "group violence."[2]

As mentioned, all of these dimensions of oppressions are intertwined; and it is certainly the case that in her descriptions, there are many resonances in relation to the experiences of a range of groups -- especially working class populations and people of color. And yet, there is something about the argument in that essay, as well as in a number of others in Justice and the Politics of Difference (including for example, chapter 6, "Social Movements and the Politics of Difference," and chapter 7, "Affirmative Action and the Myth of Merit") in which there is a sense that the arguments are "missing the ball". In part, this is because Young deals with the five faces of injustice at -- remarkably -- such an abstract level that it effaces the particularities and distinctions that put certain people, and not others, in front of the wrath of law. Thus, she points to some of the details of injustice, but stops short at considering the sources of injustice, which are, at bottom, economic, political, and somehow suspended in time, as if there is not a long history that must be remembered, which constitutes these groups and injustice. And so, even when I first read Justice and the Politics of Difference in 1991, I thought that her writings on Affirmative Action and the Myth of Merit were remarkably "race-neutral" in that she referred to "women and people of color" in the same breath, without taking the time to consider the strange lines that must be drawn in order to make these categories coherent.

In fact, the article in Section V by Máriam Martínez "On Immigration Politics in the Context of European Societies and the Structural Inequality Mode" suffers a similar problem. Martínez attempts to address structural inequalities by pointing to various features, such as racism, a "liberal logic of tolerance," and the mistaken conflation of gender and religion (which is an accurate though incomplete point) and speaking of them extremely generally. Even though Martínez does point to various concrete groups whose presences are under attack, such as Muslim women who veil, her analysis -- expanding social justice beyond "cultural difference" to include material modes of redress such as employment discrimination -- takes for granted the situation of Muslim women as a general problem facing "foreign women" (my term), rather than situating the issue in its specific historical and geo-political context, i.e., the European and North American decision to promote "Western"/"liberal" values in primitive societies, as evidenced by the decades-old, if discontiguous, war on Iraq.

It is through the writings of Kimberle Crenshaw, Patricia Hill Collins, Chandra Mohanty, and Linda Martín Alcoff that the contrived distinctions and similarities between various populations of women can be questioned and hopefully effaced -- if not erased fully -- in order to ground the claims of injustice within the particularities between various groups. Many North American and European feminist philosophers would do well to attend to the interdisciplinary theoretical interventions of transnational feminists when addressing issues of concern to women of color. In addition, while there may be many similarities regarding the exploitation and marginalization and powerlessness that affect Black Americans, Afro- and Indo-Caribbean peoples, as well as a range of other Asian immigrant populations, we must distinguish between those groups who have been subject to slavery in the United States and the Caribbean (the first two groups) and those who were subject to indentured servitude (some part of the latter two groups), in order to understand why Affirmative Action may have different saliences and take different forms for these groups. By referring to "women and people of color" without pause, the lack of distinctions render arguments about discrimination, merit, differential pay, and admissions rather ineffective.

In her essay, Bar On seems to understand this point. She explores Young's affinity with Arendt's notion of power and violence in relation to her opposition to NATO's intervention in Kosovo. Bar On points to Young's status as a democratic theorist rather than as a "political theorist of violence" in order to understand her opposition in the case of Kosovo. As she comments, Young points to official violence as appearing legitimate when used by states, and yet even state violence is "questionable because they are threats and uses of violence and thus have to be justified on a case by case basis." (106) This important distinction gives us an opening to think about the contexts of state-sponsored violence such as invasions, "humanitarian" interventions, police brutality, etc., which can be understood better by attending to the political, economic, social, and geopolitical contexts.

With this tool, Bar On tries to understand the difference between Habermas and Young on the issue of intervention into Kosovo. Bar On categorizes both thinkers as "cosmopolitan" and interested in "perpetual peace," (111) but describes Young as being more sensitive to "the political effects of socioeconomic disparities, let alone to his complicity in Eurocentricm" [sic] (108). Habermas defends NATO intervention cautiously, but Young opposes it on "Arendtian" grounds, namely that power cannot stop violence, and often is conquered by it (113). Young, rather than considering whether violence is an option under certain restricted circumstances, asks whether there are alternatives to violence.

But, asks Bar On, what would have happened if Young were to consider the Kosovo situation from a feminist perspective, namely that "NATO's action, in this respect, represents a deployment of violence by power that is justified by the compelling importance of intervening with violence and in Kosovo's case, a violence of a particularly pernicious kind." Surprisingly, Bar On argues that "NATO's presence in Kosovo seems to have had mostly positive effects" (113), although she is cautious about the argument that military intervention can be justified on humanitarian grounds, since imperialistic grounds can also be camouflaged as humanitarian grounds. Thus, she tries to escape from the impasse by expanding the notion of military intervention to include the actions that follow major violent action, including taking into account "foreseeable suffering and harm that are prevented and caused when a major violent action takes place, i.e., thinking about "postwar justice" (115). By taking this direction, Bar On retrieves an opening by which Young's account of power and violence, through a feminist lens, can be applied in defense of humanitarian intervention, even in spite of the aversion to cultural imperialism/political hegemonies that often drive such intervention.

This section ends with Denike's essay, which draws on Young's "The Logic of Masculine Protection: Reflections on the Current Security State" to explore the discourses and trends that frame post 9-11 politics in North American society. Young's essay was a timely, thoughtful, and explicit argument that grounded the logic of the Bush Presidential administration in a range of political theoretical frameworks that were masculinist and authoritarian; Hobbes' writing is one of the chief anchors of Young's article.

Denike offers an excellent summation of current and cutting-edge literature on 9-11 politics, ranging from political theory, cultural and ethnic studies, feminist theory, legal theory, and other areas. This is an engaging essay which reflects on Young's analysis, as well as the remarkable analysis of race, cultural imperialism, feminism, queer politics, and law by scholars such as Michel Foucault, Giorgio Agamben, and Jasbir Puar.

The remaining sections are also broad-ranging. Section IV, Justice: Ethics and Responsibiity, offers a look at Young's most recent and unpublished work on global responsibility (Martha Nussbaum), evil (Claudia Card), and another approach to her work on oppression, challenging it to include animal oppression (Lori Gruen). Nussbaum's essay is moving and respectfully engages Young's manuscript, Responsibility for Justice, which offers a distinction between guilt and responsibility and argues in favor of the latter, suggesting that guilt is unhelpful in thinking about structural solutions to problems of injustice. I will not review the argument here, since Nussbaum's presentation of Young is clear, eloquent, and provocative, and should be encountered without mediation. Card's and Gruen's essays are equally compelling and provocative. Card considers Young's discussion of evil in Inclusion and Democracy and Justice and the Politics of Difference. Card then suggests that that forced her to rethink her own account of evil, in which oppression and culpability are necessarily linked, and to side with Young's account with regard to oppressive social structures. Desirée Melton's article, the last in the section, attempts to bridge the link between deliberative democracy and the normative ideal of moral respect. All four essays will provide compelling, if not delightful, reading.

The final section, Justice: Democracy and Inclusion, consists of essays on global responsibility, transnational solidarity, immigration, and, in one of my favorite applications of Young's work, an analysis of how commuting to work for working-class women involves various forms of violence, exploitation, and other forms of oppression. This essay, by Ibipo Johnston-Anumonwo, is an insightful revelation of the ways in which oppression affects women through seemingly neutral activities. In this case, the distance one lives from potential employment can exacerbate joblessness, "which in turn can lead to poverty" (231). In addition, the distance between home and employment can also increase various forms of oppression, based on one's access to or dependence upon public transportation, one's time constraints with regard to child-care responsibilities, etc. Johnston-Anumonwo's analysis concludes that Black and Latina working-class women face much higher degrees of marginalization than White women.

Clearly, such forms of oppression call for solidarity in regard to social justice domestically and globally, which Young also called for. Ann Ferguson's essay supports Young's call for global responsibility, but insists that such a call requires solidarity of various kinds. She points to Carol Gould's argument for a transnational solidarity which defends and supports common interests in a more substantial manner than civic friendship or "group interest" notions of solidarity (191). Gould's notion of transnational solidarity pushes for more effective change through overlapping networks of solidarity, which enables change at multiple levels.

Young's "social connection" model of solidarity reflects an awareness that social justice is more effectively sought through social movements and people's individual awareness of their social responsibilities. Yet, as Gould argues here, this awareness must be connected to the notion of human rights in order to provide a more solid grounding of those responsibilities. Ferguson, in a similar vein to ground solidarity work more concretely, argues for feminist solidarity through an intersectional lens, along the lines of bell hooks' notion of a "sisterhood solidarity," through which one's own moral identity is involved in the promotion of the "collective good of all women which would require the elimination of all social domination relations that oppress them, not simply those of gender, i.e., sexism." (192) However, Ferguson moves one step further by requiring "those engaging in solidarity practices to transform their own identities so that they reconceive what their common interests are" (196), which is a response to the call made of white feminists by transnational feminists.

In all, this is a useful, informative collection of critical reflections on Iris Marion Young's substantial contribution to feminist, social, and political philosophy. It might do well as a supplemental text in a graduate seminar on the work of Young and other feminist and political philosophy.


Young, Iris Marion. Justice and the Politics of Difference. Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1990.

Young, Iris Marion. "The Logic of Masculine Protection: Reflections on the Current Security State." Signs: Journal of Women in Culture and Society 29, no. 1 (2003): 2-25.

[1] Young, Justice and the Politics of Difference, chap. 2.

[2] Ibid., 61ff.