Daniel Dennett

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David Thompson, Daniel Dennett, Continuum, 2009, 178pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781847060082.

Reviewed by Kevan Edwards, Syracuse University



David Thompson’s, Daniel Dennett, is a concise and highly readable introduction to the thought of an influential contemporary philosopher. The book is part of the Continuum Contemporary American Thinkers series. According to the publisher’s website, books in the series are “designed specifically to meet the needs of students and readers encountering these thinkers for the first time.”1 Consistent with the series’ intended non-specialist audience, Daniel Dennett focuses on relatively big-picture features of Dennett’s thought. In part because of its synoptic nature, the book sticks mostly to presenting Dennett’s views in a positive light.

While Dennett’s own writing is known for its accessibility and entertainment value, his corpus is large and spans a wide range of topics. This book would be a great shortcut for someone wanting to get an overall sense of Dennett’s thought in a weekend’s worth of reading. The book could serve either as a free-standing overview of Dennett’s work or as an introductory jumping-off point for more in-depth research. Philosophers and non-philosophers should find the book accessible and engaging.

It is not easy to present the work of someone as prolific as Dennett in a short text. Like most philosophers who deserve the title of ‘systematic thinker,’ it is not obvious what serves as the best point of access into the philosophical worldview that Dennett’s work has developed. Thompson clearly has given this issue serious thought, which is evident in the careful structure of the book. The book covers a range of topics, arranged thematically; those presented in early chapters are relatively free-standing and presented in a way that favors accessibility. As the book progresses, issues glossed over in earlier chapters are developed in more detail, and various pieces are brought together into an increasingly coherent and comprehensive picture.

The specific topics covered in the book include consciousness, evolution, selfhood, free will, scientific realism, ethics, and religion (in roughly the order in which they are discussed in the book). As noted earlier, several themes recur throughout various chapters; these include what the author describes as Dennett’s anti-metaphysical view of many philosophical topics, his appeals to an evolutionary paradigm, and his anti-essentialism. Insofar as there is an overarching narrative to the book, it centers on a very general picture of Dennett as a thinker who is committed to a naturalistic and highly science-friendly worldview, but who strives to find a place for what one might describe as more distinctly humanistic features: free will, morality, and even religion. As the book progresses, the topics become more focused and it becomes clearer how the pieces fit together. The final chapter pulls together various themes and offers what the author describes as a “critical assessment” of Dennett’s attempted “synthesis” of science and philosophy.

As mentioned at the outset of this review, Thompson is writing for a non-specialist audience and presumably the book is intended to be accessible for non-philosophers. Thompson’s explanations of Dennett’s views and his portrayal of Dennett’s position in the dialectical geography are relatively straightforward, especially given the complexity of the underlying issues. I found myself reacting to this with ambivalence. On the one hand, a relatively coarse-grained picture makes it easier for relative outsiders to get a grip on Dennett’s views, as well as to piece together the philosophical (and scientific) traditions of which Dennett is a part and to which he is responding. On the other hand, I suspect readers steeped in the relevant traditions will find some aspects of Thompson’s exegesis oversimplified to the point of being misleading. Just to be clear about the issue here, I am not raising doubts about Thompson’s understanding of the issues. My worry is about what I take to be editorial decisions. How best to draw the line between accessibility and precision in the context of an introductory text is a difficult question, as is whether or not Thompson has managed to strike an ideal balance.

A general example of how Thompson simplifies issues is his tendency to describe Dennett as offering an alternative to false dichotomies. To be sure, characterizing someone as being a step ahead of a field otherwise locked in a polarized debate can yield an intuitively gripping picture. Nevertheless, seeing things through this lens can lead to a distorted picture of the contribution in question, as well as the geography with which it engages. An example of this arises early in the book when Thompson presents Dennett as articulating an alternative to dualism and eliminativism. A lot turns on the intended level of abstraction of this claim, but it at least threatens to give a misleading picture of Dennett’s contribution. Arguably, what is important about Dennett’s approach is not that it offers an alternative to dualism and eliminativism, but that it offers an alternative to views that are themselves alternatives to dualism and eliminativism, namely various versions of identity-theory and functionalism.2 Roughly put, Dennett’s notion of an ‘intentional system’ claims to capture the explanatory power and naturalistic bona fides of functionalism and identity theory, but within a less ontologically committed framework. This is standard Dennett exegesis; in fact, it is consistent with what Thompson says in various places: in the first chapter, Thompson notes the connection between Dennett’s views and functionalism; and in Chapter 3, Thompson articulates a picture very similar to that described above. Nevertheless, my worry is that the dualism-versus-eliminativism dichotomy is emphasized to an extent that a non-specialist reader — the target audience of the book — is likely to settle on a misleading picture of Dennett’s contribution and also of the views to which his work presents an alternative.

Here is a more pointed, albeit more isolated, complaint along similar lines: In the process of setting up the aforementioned dichotomy between dualism and eliminativism, Thompson’s examples of philosophers who have defended dualism includes — in fact is exhausted by — John Searle and Colin McGinn. It is not clear to me how Thompson is using the term ‘dualism’ at this point, although it is worth noting that Descartes is discussed in the same chapter. Regardless, this characterization of Searle and McGinn is bound to mislead relative neophytes. It is standard to describe Searle (notably, Searle 1980) as raising problems for functionalist approaches to intentionality, consciousness, and so on; but this does not make Searle a dualist, at least not in any helpful sense of the term. Crudely put, Searle’s positive suggestion is that our brains exhibit intentionality (inter alia) in virtue of being made out of the right kind of stuff, where the right kind of stuff is not cartesian mental substance but neurons. While McGinn’s view is different from Searle’s, it still is not helpfully described as an instance of dualism. The most obvious point to highlight is that McGinn’s (1989) well-known ‘mysterian’ position is intended to be consistent with naturalism. McGinn’s basic claim is that our inability to provide a naturalistic grounding for consciousness is a result of a cognitive/epistemic deficiency, and thus should not compel one to embrace a non-naturalistic metaphysics.

At various points, Thompson describes Dennett as a “contextualist,” “anti-absolutist,” and “anti-essentialist.” I have some reservations about these labels. For one, while I can see what Thompson is aiming to capture, these labels are, to the best of my knowledge, non-standard ways of categorizing Dennett’s views. Moreover, these labels run the risk of bringing with them misleading baggage, especially for readers for whom the terms have prior resonance. For example, describing Dennett as an ‘anti-absolutist’ may lead some readers to under-appreciate the extent to which Dennett is indebted to and embedded in what is often called (for lack of a better term) the analytic tradition in philosophy. I have a similar concern about Thompson’s tendency to describe Dennett as positing multiple ‘realities’. While there might be something helpful about this description, I suspect it will lead some readers to assume that Dennett is much more of an anti-realist than he in fact is — or at least claims to be. As Thompson himself makes explicit, exactly how to place Dennett with respect to issues about realism and instrumentalism is a notoriously fraught issue. This is all the more reason to avoid relatively loose talk about Dennett being committed to multiple ‘realities’.

It is worth underlining the fact that Daniel Dennett contains very little by way of critical commentary or indications of points where other philosophers have diverged from Dennett or raised serious problems for his views. The notable exception is the final chapter of the book, about which I will say more in a moment. With respect to the lack of critical commentary, I again found myself reacting with ambivalence. Given the intended audience of the book, there is something to be said for presenting a protagonist’s views in a charitable light and for highlighting the breadth and depth of his contributions. On the other hand, introducing antagonistic characters and gesturing in the direction of potential problems can help to give the reader a richer and more accurate picture of the dialectical geography, as well as a more precise picture of the protagonist’s contributions.

By the end of the book, it is fairly clear where Thompson stands regarding some crucial issues of Dennett interpretation and criticism. Most obvious is the question of realism versus instrumentalism. Thompson’s discussion of this issue shows an obvious bias, which is especially clear in the discussion under the heading “Critical Assessment” in the final chapter. The main criticism Thompson discusses amounts to the suggestion that Dennett ought to embrace a more thoroughly pragmatist, interpretation-centered approach. The basic idea here comes from Richard Rorty, who is mentioned several times in the book. It is worth being a bit more precise about the issues here. Notably, it is one thing to suggest a threat of instability facing Dennett’s attempt to stake out an alternative to realism and instrumentalism, one that purports to capture the best of both approaches. This is a relatively non-partisan complaint, and one that has substantial prima facie plausibility. It is a different matter to articulate only one response to this instability, namely the need for a shift towards an increasingly pragmatist approach. Many card-carrying functionalists (at least those committed to so-called ‘role’ versus ‘occupant’ versions of functionalism) are likely to favor a very different response to this apparent instability, namely that Dennett has failed to realize the extent to which genuine explanation goes hand-in-hand with ontological commitment. In short, the important alternative claims that Dennett’s view is unstable not because he has failed to embrace Rorty-style pragmatism, but because he has failed to embrace the full strength of the motivations for realism.

To be fair, Thompson is explicit, in particular in the “Critical Assessment” section of the final chapter, that the main function of the book is exposition rather than assessment, and that the limited assessment he has to offer is, of necessity, incomplete. I applaud the extent to which Thompson is explicit about the limitations of his assessment, but I would have preferred a caveat to the effect that the critical analysis reflected a particular point of view. This is especially important given the intended non-specialist audience, who might otherwise expect that a limited assessment is nevertheless indicative of the range of responses to Dennett’s work. A similar partiality is shown in the (also very short) bibliography offered at the end of the book. Again, an uninformed reader who glanced though the bibliography might naturally assume that Dennett’s work is much more in dialogue with that of Husserl and Rorty than Hilary Putnam and Jerry Fodor.

In sum, aside from concerns about the extent to which the book’s framing of Dennett’s views is not as even-handed as it might come across to a non-specialist reader, most of my worries come down to ambivalence about (what I take to be) the author’s strategies for best serving the book’s intended audience. To be fair, questions about how to balance felicity and accessibility in this kind of context are vexing. Thompson clearly has grappled with these issues and made decisions with the intention of rendering a large and sophisticated corpus of work accessible and engaging.


Fodor, J. A. (1974). Special Sciences (Or: The Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis). Synthese, 28(2), 97-115.

Lewis, D. K. (1972). Psychophysical and Theoretical Identifications. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 249-258.

Lewis, D. K. (1994). Reduction of Mind. In S. Guttenplan (Ed.), A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind (pp. 412-421). Blackwell.

McGinn, C. (1989). Can We Solve the Mind-Body Problem? Mind, 98(391), 349-366.

Putnam, H. (1975). The Nature of Mental States. In Philosophical Papers (Vol. 2, pp. 429-440). Cambridge UP.

Searle, J. R. (1980). Minds, Brains, and Programs. Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 3(3), 417-457.

Smart, J. J. C. (1959). Sensations and Brain Processes. The Philosophical Review, 68(2), 141-156.

2 See, e.g., Putnam (1975), Smart (1959), Lewis (1972), Fodor (1974). It is worth noting that the line between functionalism and identity-theory is not always clear (see, e.g., Lewis 1994).