Daniel Dennett

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Brook, Andrew and Ross, Don (eds.), Daniel Dennett, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 302pp, $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521008646.

Reviewed by Dave Beisecker, University of Nevada Las Vegas


Daniel Dennett has become one of those philosophers about whom virtually everyone in the field feels compelled to take a stance. But what about Dennett’s impact outside of philosophy? This anthology seeks to distinguish itself from the many others devoted to Dennett’s work (including an MIT volume compiled by the same editors) by assessing Dennett’s broader reach. To this end, the editors asked a team of non-philosophers and philosophers with specializations beyond philosophy to gauge the influence of Dennett’s work in their own areas of expertise. This volume includes papers by researchers in developmental psychology, cognitive ethology, artificial intelligence, and economics, as well as philosophers with specializations in cognitive science, consciousness studies, neuroscience, and evolutionary theory. All but a portion of one of the ten essays are previously unpublished.

In keeping with the aims of the Cambridge series on Contemporary Philosophy in Focus, this collection opens with an introductory overview of Dennett’s thought by the editors. Though it was circulated to the other authors while they prepared their essays, subsequent references to this introduction are minimal; the other chapters are self-contained and (as will be evident from this review) can be read in any order. Brook and Ross portray Dennett as a key figure in the cognitivist revolution, which replaced the “simple empiricism” of Ryle and Quine with a view that human action requires interpretation in terms of “a rich repertoire of mental states and processes,” which are best identified “by viewing the mental as having the shape it has due to natural selection.”(p.12) They particularly note the increasingly prominent role Dennett assigns to evolution in grounding applications of the intentional stance. “The really original and interesting part of Dennett’s work is found in his view of what the world that underlies that schema [the intentional stance] is like. What underlies the intentional stance and justifies it as an explanatory schema is a powerful, comprehensive view about the nature of intentionality and the role of natural selection (evolution) in its very coming to be.”(p.17) As they construe it, mental activity becomes discernible to interpreters in the context of their asking the question, ‘what would be the smart thing for a subject to do, believe, and desire, given its selective environment and history.’(p.20) While Dennett follows his mentor Ryle in holding that intentional states are not, strictly speaking, the causes of behavior, they nevertheless play an indispensable role enabling us to employ reverse engineering to discover the inner springs of action. As we do so, we find ourselves compelled to give up the image of mind as Cartesian Theatre and to dispel such quaint philosophical notions as qualia, along with the idea that we possess a special “intrinsic” intentionality above and beyond that attributed to frogs and thermostats.

These quaint notions, however, answer to the overwhelming sense that our minds are somehow distinct from the rest of creation. As such, they die hard, and their ghosts still haunt Dennett’s work. Andy Clark raises this point at the beginning of his essay: “Dennett depicts human minds as both deeply different from, yet profoundly continuous with, the minds of other animals and simple agents.”(p.187) One might say that Dennett’s philosophy harbors a disquietingly Orwellian streak: all animals are equal, yet some are more equal than others. Several contributors address Dennett’s attempts to reconcile this dual perspective – in particular his thesis that our “Gregorian”-type minds have latched onto certain “memes” or “mind-tools” (namely language), which elevate our consciousness to a higher plane, and which generate the illusion of a Cartesian Theatre replete with sensory qualities. Although he’s open to the idea that language is a mind-tool that allows us to extend our cognitive capacities, Clark fears that Dennett takes this idea too far. He can see how language might enable us to spin narratives that enable us to cross a threshold to become genuine persons capable of morally responsible deliberation, but he fails to see how language has much to do with phenomenal consciousness.

Paul Churchland’s essay also challenges the idea that our distinctive type of consciousness is a culturally transmitted meme or virtual machine that spreads across brains as computer viruses spread through computer networks. According to Churchland, the actual architecture of our brains belies this metaphor. Instead, Churchland sketches how several features of phenomenal consciousness might be explained in terms of the activity of recurrent neural nets. Since the brains of nonlinguistic animals generally share the same recurrent structure with our brains, Churchland urges us to downplay any alleged distinction between our type of consciousness and that of the brutes.

Even so, Dennett clearly sees a significant distinction between creatures that adopt the intentional stance and those that do not. Two of the essays by non-philosophers are devoted to empirical attempts to locate where this threshold is crossed. Richard Griffin and Simon Bar-Cohen recount experiments in developmental psychology that are meant to pinpoint when human infants are sufficiently sensitive to the minds of others to warrant possession of a “theory of mind,” while Robert Seyfarth and Dorothy Cheyney survey attempts in cognitive ethology to establish that some non-human animals exhibit second-order intentionality. Seyfarth and Cheyney tell us that Dennett’s intentional stance “offers an analytical scheme that, in the hands of many investigators, has led to experiments that are beginning to clarify the mechanisms that underlie communication in animals.”(p.123) Nevertheless, they close by admitting that ethologists have yet to find “in the elementary features of social behavior, the crucial evolutionary break point: a problem that requires second-order intentionality and cannot be solved in any other way.”(p.135) Griffin and Bar-Cohen take Dennett’s reluctance to posit cognitive saltations to show that we shouldn’t expect to find such break-points. As in the animal case, attempts to show just when infants acquire a rudimentary theory of mind are inconclusive at best. Beyond that, they suggest that Dennett’s influence upon developmental psychology is more modest than one might think, if only because young children (and perhaps many adults) lack the conceptual resources to adopt the intentional stance as described in the introductory essay.

Time for a general remark. Dennett tells us that our minds differ from those of simpler creatures in at least two respects: we are capable of both language and second-order intentionality. However, he is generally unclear about the relationship between these capacities. Unfortunately, none of the essays in this collection explore that topic. That’s a shame, for this is clearly one issue where philosophers can come to the aid of their more empirically-minded counterparts. Both the essays by the developmental psychologists and by the ethologists simply assume that genuine linguistic communication would have to require second-order intentionality, as if they’re unaware of viable alternatives to the standard “Gricean” picture of the relationship between second-order intentionality and language use (or between thought, talk, and thought and talk about thought and talk). Evidently, philosophers have not done a great job bringing these more attractive alternatives to their attention.

Andrew Brook’s essay focuses upon Dennett’s rejection of the traditional, Cartesian conception of conscious experience. Brook reminds us that Dennett doesn’t really try to explain consciousness itself so much as he attempts to make sense of the judgments we make about conscious experience. Dennett rejects the Cartesian Theatre in favor of the Multiple Drafts Model because the former demands a precision in these judgments when in fact there is none. Still, Brook worries that Dennett’s focus on particular hard cases leads him too quickly to dismiss talk about the qualitative character of conscious experience. Although nothing answers to the notion of qualia as traditionally conceived, Brook points out that we cannot simply abandon all talk about what conscious experience seems to be like. But if this is so, then one could well wonder why Dennett opts to “Quine” the notion of qualia rather than “Dennetting” it. Wouldn’t it be more in character were he instead to regard talk about the qualitative character of experience as having the same status as talk about intentional states like belief? Brook’s point is particularly well-taken, once we consider (as Brook does not) that judgments about ‘what it’s like’ figure prominently in the attribution of a peculiar sort of knowledge. Instead of dismissing such talk as ultimately unintelligible, it would seem that the thoroughgoing Dennettian ought to develop some story about what we interpreters are doing when we say that someone like colorblind Mary fails to know what it’s like to see red or that we are unable to know what it’s like to be a bat.

Like Brook, Kathleen Akins also addresses Dennett’s rejection of the Cartesian Theatre, but at the level of sub-personal cognitive science. Akins takes Dennett’s chief contribution to cognitive neuroscience to be the appreciation that the contents of our sub-personal neural states need not – and likely will not – line up with the contents of the attributions we make from the intentional stance. The fact that subjects report having a single, unified, phenomenal image of the world around them in no way implies the existence of a single unified image at the neural level. As she sees it, the chief Cartesian error is to suppose that the function of the visual system is to produce such a single image, which is then surveyed by higher cognitive processes. Through an extended discussion of the “extraordinarily heterogeneous” neural processes underlying depth perception, of which we are completely unaware at the phenomenological level, Akins argues that “the ontology of the perceived world is not mirrored by the ontology of visual processing – that what appear to us as singular properties, objects, and events in the world are unlikely to be discerned by single [sub-personal] specialists.”(p.239) Akins suggests that the difficulties we occasionally encounter describing just “what it’s like” to have a certain experience is a product of conflicting information provided by different perceptual sub-specialists.

Yorick Wilks’ essay is the most negative of the bunch. Wilks thinks Dennett offers little that is of use to research in artificial intelligence. If anything, the influence has gone in the other direction. Computer scientists were blithely attributing beliefs to thermostats long before Dennett had arrived on the scene to endorse the practice. Rather than providing a refreshing counterpoint to the other essays, this paper is a poignant example of philosophy’s perceived irrelevance. According to Wilks, AI researchers are more preoccupied by “everyday” concerns than by “idle” philosophical speculations regarding the metaphysical status of intentional states. As a result, he seems to think that AI researchers can free themselves from the kinds of concerns that vex Dennett, so much so that they need not even bother responding to Searle’s criticisms of strong AI. (p.258) But just as philosophical speculation without experiential application is empty, empirical application uninformed by philosophical speculation is blind. Wilks ignores legitimate roles philosophical inquiry in general, and Dennett’s thought in particular, can play helping to set plausible targets for AI research. In particular, he overlooks how philosophy might help to delimit the rational patterns of behavior by which mental activity is discernible and the attribution of intentionality is grounded.

In the first of two contributions, Don Ross acknowledges that Dennett has not exercised wide influence in the social sciences. However, rather than taking this to be a sign of his irrelevance, Ross suggests that one can marshal Dennett’s thought to expose the weaknesses of the standard social science model (SSSM), which in turn can lead to a better understanding of the relationships the social sciences bear to one another and to more basic sciences. This essay is the most interesting in the batch – the one for which I most wanted to see Dennett’s response. Rather than viewing social and cultural forces in competition with biological ones (as the SSSM does), Dennett’s thought, Ross argues, provides a perspective from which we can see socio-cultural and biological forces operating a different levels of explanation. In particular, Ross maintains that economics is most accurately viewed as a branch (or perhaps extension) of Dennettian intentional-systems theory. Instead of trying to uncover the inner mechanisms that drive the behavior of actual creatures, economists proceed by working out the consequences of axioms that define the behavior of ideally rational agents. Once economic theory is augmented with the conceptual resources of game theory, macro-economists are able to study interactive effects between agents’ second-order intentional states to uncover irreducibly social equilibria that are invisible from more individualistic, micro-economic perspectives. Ross then tells us that the other standard social sciences serve to provide “analytic narratives,” which draw upon particular historical constraints to explain observed departures from the predictions of pure macro-economic theory. Thus, these other standard social sciences stand to economics much as Dennett thinks sub-personal cognitive psychology stands to intentional-systems theory in cognitive evolutionary psychology.

The anthology concludes with a second essay by Ross, which turns to a debate where Dennett has arguably garnered the greatest attention: the unfortunately acerbic battles he has waged with Gould and Searle in the popular press. Ross’s chapter identifies several instances where popular commentators on the so-called “Darwin wars” have mistakenly viewed Dennett’s embrace of adaptive explanations as endorsing a reductionism that seeks to dispense with humanistic values altogether. But while Ross is correct to point out that Dennett’s views have been misrepresented, there nevertheless remains something to the charge that Dennett tries to make “Darwin’s Dangerous Idea” do too much. Ross follows Dennett in making much of the idea that, as products of natural selection, we can be viewed as intentional in the same way that frogs and chess-playing computers can. (E.g., p. 286) But if Dennett is to succeed in turning this observation into a full-blown case against the notion of original intentionality, he further needs to show that that’s the only way in which our behavior can be seen as exhibiting intentionality, which he never does. Nowhere does he demonstrate that there couldn’t be rational patterns of behavior that are discernible as such, without having to understand the subjects in question as subject to some sort of selection. Linguistic behavior immediately springs to mind as an example of such originally intentional activity, for it seems that we can understand creatures such as ourselves as speaking to one another without ever having to appeal to their actual selective history. So while our intentionality presumably “derives” from Mother Nature in the relatively mundane sense that it is the product of the operation of natural selection, it doesn’t follow that our intentionality would have to be “derived” in more interesting ways. Specifically, it doesn’t follow that the overall rationality of our behavior is discernible only against the backdrop of purposes for which we’ve been designed or selected. Dennett’s conclusion that our intentionality must be as derived as that of simpler biological organisms runs these distinct senses of “derived” together.

This criticism isn’t explored in the volume as much as it should be. The point is that there’s not just one intentional stance, and so no reason to believe in only a single way in which behavior must be understood as exhibiting intentionality. Instead, there’s a cluster of such stances, corresponding to different ways in which assumptions of rationality can be articulated. As Ross himself points out, game theory operates with a conception of rationality allowing one to see that there are outcomes that are perfectly rational from a narrow individualistic perspective, which are evidently ir rational from a perspective that allows creatures to consider the preferences of others. Such creatures are rationally obliged to seek means of cooperating with one another. The theory of communicative behavior works with yet another, distinct conception of rationality. For example, adherence to a sort of charity principle is rationally required of competent members of a linguistic community, independently of their particular preferences. If we find others systematically using some term in a way that we think they shouldn’t, then we should adjust our sense of how that term ought to be used. To persistently correct others, despite evidence that their linguistic dispositions are in line with common practice, would be to engage in a patently irrational course of action that threatens the stability of the whole communicative enterprise. In sum, the notion of rationality is not nearly as monolithic as Dennett’s work suggests. There are a variety of rational patterns and distinct ways in which creatures can exhibit irrational behavior. Once this point is appreciated, I think philosophers will be in a better position than at present to help special sciences, like ethology and developmental psychology, which seek to articulate where various cognitive thresholds are crossed and what conceptual resources are required to identify these thresholds. Not only that, we might be able to extend Ross’ own vision of intentional-systems theory to encompass not just micro- and macro-economics, but also elements of additional disciplines (e.g., communication theory) as well.

So in the end, what do we learn from this volume about Dennett’s impact outside philosophy? The message I got was mixed, and likely at odds with the editors’ intended conclusion. Outside of consciousness studies (whose distinctness from philosophy can certainly be debated), Dennett’s potential influence far outstrips his actual impact, which is surprisingly slight. Moreover, the essay by Wilks as well as Ross’ second contribution underscore the fact that philosophers have their work cut out for them to prevent future misunderstanding. As a philosopher, I find this verdict rather sobering. One would have thought that Dennett would be chief among living philosophers to reach (as opposed to merely being read by) a wider audience.