Dark Feelings, Grim Thoughts: Experience and Reflection in Camus and Sartre

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Robert C. Solomon, Dark Feelings, Grim Thoughts: Experience and Reflection in Camus and Sartre, Oxford University Press, 2006, 241pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195181573.

Reviewed by William L. McBride, Purdue University


This collection of eight essays, together with a brief Introduction and Conclusion, is more or less evenly divided between its two putatively gloomy heroes. Chapters 1, 2, 5, and 8 deal, respectively, with Camus' L'Etranger, Myth of Sisyphus, Plague, and Fall, while 3, 4, and 7 concern, respectively, Sartre's Nausea, Esquisse d'une théorie des émotions, and No Exit. Chapter 6, the longest, is a critique and analysis of Sartre's treatment of "bad faith" in Being and Nothingness. As the author informs us on p. 10, "Some of the chapters [namely, 1, 7, 2, and 4, although this last is here mislabeled as 5] have been previously published, but all have been thoroughly revised and rewritten." Even for "the amazingly large group of people who read everything Solomon writes" to whom Charles Guigonon refers in his bookjacket blurb, then, there is presumably enough that is new to justify purchase.

The book's main title is above all a come-on rather than an accurate reflection of most of Solomon's thought-provoking analyses, whereas the sub-title does indeed capture one of his central themes: to wit, that both authors were masters of the phenomenological (or at least frequently -- not always, as we shall see -- phenomenological) description of experience that more purely reflective approaches to philosophy lack, although reflection is less separable from experience than either of them sometimes seems to think it is. Essentially, Professor Solomon enjoys and admires both writers despite the many flaws that he purports to identify in each of them along the way. His approach is deliberately casual and does not give pride of place to rigor or systematicity, and on occasion he relies too heavily on his readers' prior familiarity with the works discussed, but he is informed and often astute. I shall begin by commenting briefly on a few of his remarks about philosophical method and then offer a few selective observations and criticisms of his treatments, first of Camus and then of Sartre.

In the course of his commentary on The Stranger, Solomon stresses the relative lack of "argument" in Camus' writings and the weakness of such "arguments" as may be found in them to the effect, for instance, that life is absurd. No matter, according to the author, because what he here calls "everyday phenomenology" (p. 46) has the capacity, in the hands of a master like Camus, of making the reader aware of aspects of our experience that cannot be accessed by straightforward argumentation. The Sartre of La Nausée is also, for Solomon, a good phenomenologist (p. 61), and introducing his "Meditations on Nausea", as he entitles Chapter 3, enables him to say something about the phenomenological method of Husserl as it was first revealed to Sartre by Raymond Aron in the famous café conversation in which the latter excitedly informed Sartre that, using this method, one could philosophize about the drink on the table.

But throughout most of the book the author's focus is not primarily on explaining the nature of the method, whether in its everyday or more rigorous versions. The reader is therefore left somewhat baffled when he or she is informed that "The Plague [is] the least phenomenological of all of Camus' novels" because, allegedly, it reveals its characters through their behavior rather than their experience (p. 167) or that, more surprisingly, Sartre's attempted illustrations of bad faith in Being and Nothingness are not, "properly speaking, phenomenological." The reason given for this latter assertion is that "Phenomenology is the careful and insightful description of one's own experiences," whereas "most of Sartre's examples here are descriptions of other people's experiences." (p. 153) Husserl, I think, would have been startled by this way of distinguishing phenomenological sheep from non-phenomenological goats, and so was I.

Solomon's "casual" approach to method, as I have expressed it, takes, as it seems to me, a slightly cruel turn in a paragraph in which he exalts the phenomenological appeal to "eidetic" experiences over careful argumentation by recounting the admiration he felt, as a 19-year old reading the Sartrean text presumably for the first time, for Sartre's ability to bring out the reality of human freedom through his description of a walk along a precipice. The author comments:

"It remains the definitive reply to all my friends who are still publishing books and articles trying to define that miniscule 'gap' in determinism or the nuances of meaning between 'reasons' and 'causes' of action. Freedom is our reality; it does not need proof, but only a moment's experience." (p. 86)

While in no way wishing to denigrate or dismiss the force of Sartre's description, as certain rigid and dogmatic philosophers who consider their own methods to be uniquely valuable might do, I am also disinclined cavalierly to dismiss careful analyses of freedom by Solomon's friends, some of whom are also my own; indeed, Sartre himself in later years sometimes used gap-like language in characterizing the greatly diminished role that he had come to attribute to freedom within largely deterministic social structures.

As far as Solomon's depiction of Camus is concerned, the reader is left with a decidedly mixed message. At the end of his chapter on Camus' Sisyphus, for example, Solomon admits (once again) that Camus' arguments are not very good, his core notions wither away under even mild criticism (much less the sort levelled by Jeanson and later Sartre in the famous quarrel over Camus' The Rebel), "and his phenomenology smacks more of the quick appeal to the ten-second television ad than deep analysis." (p. 58) Already in his Introduction, Solomon had declared point-blank: "The Rebel is, I personally opine, a book that had better never been published at all." (p. 8) (And to think that I once worried that some of my judgments of that book might appear too harsh!) In his chapter on that "least phenomenological" novel, The Plague, he expresses deep dislike for the central character, Dr. Rieux. Finally, in his chapter dealing with The Fall, he seems to be nearly as fascinated by the late Phillip Quinn's interesting Christian reading of that novel (in Midwest Studies in Philosophy 16, 1971) as he is by the theme of the novel itself, and he concludes by suggesting that Camus was deeply pathological: "Camus' 'happiness' is the mania of a hysteric, a final burst of desperation and unhappiness that chooses to express itself in the language of flourishing and fulfillment." (p. 212) And yet he repeatedly proclaims that both Sartre and Camus were great, "exemplary" philosophers (of experience, at least) -- "philosophical beacons", as he expresses it on the penultimate line of his text. (p. 218)

Sartre is treated somewhat more sympathetically than Camus in this book, but the treatment is quite uneven. Early on in his Introduction, Solomon perpetuates a destructive and highly inaccurate myth when he characterizes the contrasting personae of Camus and Sartre, as they were perceived during the late 1950s, as "Camus the bon homme, Sartre the somber Stalinist." (p. 5) He regards Roquentin, the central figure in Nausea, as a thoroughly detestable scoundrel, "about as unlikable as a protagonist or a narrator can be, making even Dostoevsky's Underground Man look rather kindly by comparison." (p. 179) To me, at least, a frequent re-reader of Nausea, this judgment seems very wrong, in fact just plain odd. But what Solomon takes to be odd is the leitmotif of Sartre's entire early literary and philosophical explorations, namely, his "odd obsession with the notions of contingency and existence." (p. 80) This way of putting it seems to place a very large number of leading philosophers over the centuries at risk of being similarly labelled as "oddly obsessive" -- although perhaps Solomon believes that this is as it should be.

While Solomon's critical but appreciative chapter on Sartre's early treatise on the emotions is balanced and insightful, putting into perspective the serious flaws of what Solomon calls the "hydraulic" conception of the emotions favored by Freud and others, his longer analysis of Sartre's account of bad faith is less balanced and less insightful. To my mind, the most interesting and valuable criticisms in this chapter are those concerning the sexist bias of Sartre's account, based in large measure on citations from an article by Kathleen Higgins, whom Solomon identifies as his spouse. One of his own principal themes here, namely, that whatever cogency Sartre's description of the phenomenon of bad faith may have is dependent on the dimension of being-for-others, something that Sartre seems largely to ignore in the text in question (p. 163), is accurate enough, but the author fails sufficiently to acknowledge the importance of the structural requirements and restraints that Sartre had imposed on himself in the composition of Being and Nothingness. Sartre presents the description of behaviors of bad faith as being, in the last analysis, simply a mechanism or device to lead the reader to his central insight of the first part of the book, to wit, that being-for-itself is a peculiar sort of entity, characterized above all as lack, as nothing in itself; the detailed discussion of being-for-others was only to be introduced much later in the book. One may question the wisdom of Sartre's decision to follow this sequence in writing his opus magnum, but the fact that this was his decision explains why, contra Solomon's assertion that "Sartre seems to forget the peculiarly Kantian question ['How is bad faith possible?'] as the chapter gets under way" (p. 144), the whole chapter was designed to help lay the groundwork for Sartre's answer to that question in terms of his conception of human reality.

Two additional features of the chapter on bad faith seem to me worthy of special mention. The first "feature" consists, in keeping with Sartrean ways of thinking, of a lack: missing from the chapter are references to some of the most significant scholarly debates of recent years on this very topic, most notably the work of Catalano and Santoni. (There is one citation from a recent book by the latter, but it has to do with a different issue, the issue of violence.) While I never wish to insist that writers on any given philosophical topic should feel obliged to canvass most, much less all, of the recent publications dealing with it, this is a case in which the author might have benefited from a more comprehensive casting of his net. The second feature is Solomon's own proposed substitute account of a behavior in bad faith, an imagined first-person narrative in which his supposed "tightness" with respect to money leads him to leave a restaurant waitress a tip of only 13%, a fact that then causes him shame and embarrassment. While I regret the imagined waitress's loss of up to $1 (or perhaps even more, if it was an expensive restaurant) by comparison with what she supposedly should have received, I somehow doubt that this example of low tipping by the pseudo-Solomon will ever replace Sartre's café waiter as an illustration of patterns of bad faith in the philosophical literature. I am not even convinced that it is a better instantiation of the phenomenological method.

But I invite interested readers to judge for themselves concerning the fairness of my criticisms here, criticisms which should not lead to the erroneous conclusion that I am generally unsympathetic to the author's many interesting observations and analyses.