Dark Ghettos: Injustice, Dissent, and Reform

Placeholder book cover

Tommie Shelby, Dark Ghettos: Injustice, Dissent, and Reform, Harvard University Press, 2016, 340pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674970502.

Reviewed by Lucius T. Outlaw, Jr., Vanderbilt University


Tommie Shelby turns his attention to metropolitan neighborhoods throughout the United States of America, composed mostly of black people (hence "dark" ghettos), that are characterized by high rates of concentrated poverty, violence, racial segregation, street crime, joblessness, family instability, welfare receipt, drug abuse, teenage pregnancy, and school dropouts. It is in virtue of such features that these neighborhoods are stigmatized as "ghettos" (p. 1). The stigma is imposed on the residents, as well. Shelby's concern: how best to think philosophically about these neighborhoods and residents, not with regard to how best to ameliorate their unfairly conditioned lives, but to how it is that such life-affecting ghetto conditions came to exist and persist. For Shelby, the issue is a matter of justice: that is, how it has been, and remains, the case that "background conditions" affecting the "basic structure" of the U.S. American political-economy and social orders have been systemically unjust due to legacies of invidious racialized enslavement, other forms of invidious racial discrimination and exploitation, and continuing practices of the same. As a "dark" person himself, Shelby openly declares his solidarity with those in the dark ghettos, and with a tradition of struggles by dark folks "standing and fighting" against the invidiously racialized impositions on their lives: "I have no greater conviction than the imperative to keep faith with this majestic and honorable tradition" (p. 6).

In service to this tradition as a political philosopher concerned with matters of justice, Shelby elects to articulate a framework of principles of justice by which to make evident that the creation and persistence of dark ghettos are due to systematic injustice (p. 4) for which "the state" is culpable; to show why, accordingly, there are ethical limits on interventions "the state" may undertake in endeavoring to "assist" the poor and severely disadvantaged residents of dark ghettos; and to explain "what the unjustly disadvantaged are morally required and permitted to do in response to the unjust conditions that circumscribe their lives" (p. 5). A focal commitment of Shelby's in pursuing these three objectives is to acknowledge and respect fully the agency of the residents of dark ghettos in keeping with his commitments to the normative principles and agenda of his Rawlsian-(and Kantian- and Millian-) influenced notion of egalitarian liberalism that takes seriously individual liberty, civic equality, and "substantive economic equality" (p. 10).

But, Shelby is not just concerned with an ideal. Rather, he is committed to contribute -- by way of philosophical reflections on actual matters of political ethics (systematic injustice conditioned by a long and continuing history of invidious racial discrimination and exploitation) -- to an enhanced understanding of the persistence of ghettos, an understanding which recognizes and respects the ethical standing of ghetto residents and joins their efforts to secure just equality. And for Shelby, this project in political ethics compels us to see that ameliorative attention must be focused on what is causally key to the creation and persistence of dark ghettos: injustice in the racialized and exploitative ordering of the "basic structure" of the U.S. American polity -- particularly of its social, political, economic, and cultural institutions -- in service to the master project of White Racial Supremacy.

It is to this "basic structure" that attention should be directed, Shelby argues, rather than to other factors that many have argued, and continue to argue, are explanatory of and/or are the causes of ghetto conditions for which the residents, regarding particular factors or causes, can be held responsible morally and practically: "residential segregation, cultural configurations, reproductive choices, single-mother families, joblessness, crime, and mass incarceration" (p. 8). Shelby devotes a chapter to each of these factors or supposed causes ("Community," "Culture," "Reproduction," "Family," "Work," "Crime," and "Punishment," respectively) and in doing so takes on a massive amount of social science research, policy proscriptions, and position-takings in political philosophy all intended as contributions to, diagnoses of and/or guides to correcting -- or isolating and containing if correction is not forthcoming -- the attitudes, character, and behavior of ghetto residents. Throughout his engagement with the supposed explanations and proffered corrections, Shelby poses his persistent and consistent check: can dark, poor, imposed-on residents of ghettos not of their creation can be held morally responsible for their lives and conditions if the basic structure conditioning their lives and behavior has been systematically and persistently unjust, across generations, as a function of laws, policies, practices, complicity, and neglect by "the state"? In each case, Shelby argues with discipline and determination that, regarding each of the areas of concern or factors of supposed explanation or causality, "the state," and, by implication, with the complicity of many of us who are citizens of "the state," has failed to ensure the realization of conditions of just egalitarian fairness. And where there is such failure, "the state" lacks ethical standing to impose supposed remedial or constricting (carceral) measures on ghetto residents.

The failures have even more profound -- even, I might say, radical -- implications: on Shelby's reasoning, as citizens subject to systematic injustice, ghetto residents are to significant extents not morally bound to comply with unjust laws, to obey officers and officials administering unjust laws or administering laws in unjust ways; nor are they morally compelled to comport their lives in keeping with imposed normative imperatives thought appropriate for guiding identity-formation, personal decorum, civic behavior and participation when such imperatives have not been forged through fair democratic reciprocal participation inclusive of dark residents of imposed ghettos. Rather, in conditions where the "duty of justice" toward citizens in ghettos is lacking, their duty to self-respect generates a compelling ethical justification for them to engage in resisting all such normative impositions.  This is bcause, Shelby argues, in agreement with Rawls, a democratically just society is best conceived as "a fair system of cooperation" within which social justice is constituted by "the legitimate claims and responsibilities individuals have within a fair overall social arrangement . . . justice is a matter of reciprocity between persons who regard each other as equals" (p. 20). Dark ghettos, Shelby argues, are socially-structured systematical failures at reciprocity, historically so structured by "the state" (legalized enslavement of dark peoples; legalized invidious racial discrimination and exploitation of them; continued economic exploitation and impoverishment; invidious racialized and class-infected residential social segregation; unjust policing and incarceration; disrespect and disregard of various forms and modes of the agency of dark folks). As a consequence of this fundamental failure in upholding the duty to justice, injustice has become widely and deeply imbedded in the economic, socio-cultural, and political orders of the U.S. polity.

Shelby makes his case through nuanced, broadly conversant, and intellectually articulate discursive engagements with other thinkers and policy advocates. (One has to be impressed by the wide range and sheer volume of publications, listed in his copious footnotes, with which he engages.) In doing so he takes care to forge numerous analytical distinctions that are designed to further his aim of making the case for a "political ethics of resistance and dissent" on behalf of the residents of dark ghettos. Shelby positions himself as a political philosopher and a political ethicist in service to dark ghetto residents for whose respectful standing and political agency he argues strenuously. However, he makes the arguments on their behalf. At no point does Shelby have residents speaking for themselves save for the discussion of an example of "impure dissent" he takes to be represented by some of the lyrics, and the project, of a particular album created and released by the Hip Hop artist Nas. In this respect, and on several counts, I find Shelby's otherwise conversant, well-argued, analytically prolific and creative, passionate-yet-disciplined partisan contribution to non-ideal political philosophy worrisome.

First, for all of his laudable concern to argue for respect for the ethical agency and duty-bound commitment to self-respect of dark ghetto denizens, it is Shelby who makes the case for them. They are subjects of his discursive effort; they are not Subjects involved in and contributing to the discourse regarding them. Shelby's audience, his discursive partners, are other professional scholars, researchers, and policy theorists who are the producers of the works in his endnotes, others who comprise the audiences at his presentations, colleagues with whom he converses about the issues, even students in his seminars, though within all of these discursive subsets there may be some who are of dark ghettos.

This positioning of himself relative to those of his concern is especially striking given Shelby's acknowledged poignant inspiration for his efforts: Kenneth B. Clark's "important but neglected work Dark Ghetto: Dilemmas of Social Power (1965)" (p. 279). It is worth quoting at length Shelby's appraisal of Clark's effort:

Grasping the importance of listening to the voices of the ghetto poor, Clark's prologue, titled 'The Cry of the Ghetto', consists of thirty-two quotes from ghetto denizens, male and female and of all ages, who reflect on their plight and register their strong dissent from the status quo, condemning racism and discrimination, economic inequality and exploitation, lack of access to decent education, police brutality and harassment, inadequate protection from violence, political marginalization, media representations of black life, and American imperialism. In Clark's text, the ghetto poor are treated as agents of social change, as playing a central role in rebuilding their communities, and as taking the lead in reform efforts. (pp. 281-282)

The last sentence in the quote is sobering in the contrast it shows between Clark's rendering of dark ghetto residents' activism devoted to reform of their communities and Shelby's approach. Shelby argues for the dark ghetto poor as agents of principled resistance to systemic injustice, but none are spokespersons for such on their own behalf. Shelby, I must conclude, argues an interpretative case on their behalf, but without any evidence that those on whose behalf he argues have authorized him to speak for them. His doing so is self-assigned.

This gives rise to my second worry: that this lack of any evidence of broad and deep living engagements with, and authorization by, those of whom, and on whose behalf, Shelby speaks means that his argument on their behalf suffers from the anemia of analytic abstraction and socially distanced interpretation. Consequently, Shelby's claims regarding the ethicality of the resistance and dissent of dark ghetto residents lack confirmation as being part of those residents' self-understandings. Shelby's characterization of particular modes of their behavior as ethically appropriate dissent and resistance in conditions of injustice is ripe for misappropriation as a rationalization (in the bad sense) of their behavior (as when more than a few in my Black Power generation characterized minor theft from a retail establishment -- say, of a pair of sunglasses -- as "liberation" of the stolen objects from the ill-gotten gains through racist exploitations of "the Man"). Furthermore, since we have no way of knowing whether the ghetto residents understand their behavior as Shelby characterizes it (as a political ethics of resistance and dissent), what assurance do we have, or can we have, that their behavior is or can be directed towards cooperative fashioning of a more just society, especially behavior that is law-breaking and deliberately nonconforming even with norms other dark folks think appropriate?

There are stern historic lessons to be considered from similar contexts, in particular the struggles for social justice in South Africa and in other nation-states on the African continent where young people, even children, were recruited into the struggles, armed struggles, even, in which, in too many instances, they spent their childhood and young adulthood. Trained to kill and to withhold respect for prevailing authority that was fostering and defending unjust societies, it was discovered that, with the initial struggles won, many of those children and young folks who came of age withholding their respect for "the authorities" of the prevailing unjust orders were thus socialized into withholding respect for all authority! And this challenge had to be faced along with that of determining how best to demobilize several generations who had come of age engaging in sanctioned killing.

Socially sanctioned behavior is educative. Shelby's disciplined and passionate effort on behalf of the residents of dark ghettos is an especially notable and provocative interpretive venture, but I am not convinced that it has the virtue of being educative, nor that it has the endorsement of those for whom he advocates. And on both counts, I worry. Though he pronounces his determination to keep faith with a long black tradition of openly "standing and fighting" injustices in his efforts to articulate "an ethics of the oppressed" (p. 6), I do not detect an appreciation by Shelby of the strenuous efforts devoted to ethical education that gave moral force and guidance to, for example, the Civil Rights Movement, efforts that served thousands who were dark denizens of locales readily characterized as "ghettos," but that for many were vibrant communities. And a great many who joined the Movement were conscious of the ethical commitments to which they were educated in the Movement and by which they largely governed themselves. The case did not have to be made for them in talking about them. They lived their ethical commitments while keeping faith in the possibilities for helping bring into being a more just and free society in which their humanity would be recognized and respected.