Darwinian Creativity and Memetics

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Maria Kronfeldner, Darwinian Creativity and Memetics, Acumen, 2011, 165pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781844652563.

Reviewed by Arran Gare, Swinburne University


If rigorous argument were the basis for determining the acceptance or rejection of ideas, then Maria Kronfeldner's Darwinian Creativity and Memetics should finally put to rest Richard Dawkins' evolutionary theory of culture based on the notion of 'memes'. Examining the analogy between genes and their role in evolution, as conceived by Dawkins, and the role of memes, Kronfeldner argues convincingly that the analogy does not hold. That is, even without criticizing Dawkins' views on biological evolution and allowing that his version of neo-Darwinism is a valid model of scientific theory to emulate in the human sciences, Kronfeldner shows that the notion of memes does not stand up as a valid scientific concept to explain the evolution of culture. It is impossible to identify some bounded entities in or supporting human culture equivalent to genes (whether brain patterns, behavior patterns, symbolic artefacts or anything else) which replicate to generate variations which are differentially selected by processes not coupled with and so therefore are validly seen as causal influences on this replication process. That is, there is nothing in human culture equivalent to strings of DNA that replicate without this replication being influenced by the processes that determine the survival of the replicators. 'Memes' are descriptively inadequate, have no explanatory power and play no heuristic function. At most they might allow the language of evolution to be extended to the domain of culture.

If rigorous arguments were the issue, however, the memetic theory of culture should have been put to rest long ago. In 2000, the proceedings of a major conference on memetics were published by Oxford University Press as Darwinizing Culture: The Status of Memetics as a Science. Participants included two leading exponents of memetics, Daniel Dennett and Susan Blackmore, and major critics. In his introduction, editor Robert Aunger quoted from a review by Martin Gardner of Blackmore's recently published book, The Meme Machine, in which Gardner averred that

memetics is no more than a cumbersome terminology for saying what everyone knows and that can be more usefully said in the dull terminology of information transfer . . . A meme is so broadly defined by its proponents as to be a useless concept, creating more confusion than light, and I predict that the concept will soon be forgotten as a curious linguistic quirk of little value.

The critics of memetics coming from a range of disciplines (the history of science, psychology and cultural anthropology) provided solid support for Gardner's contention. In his conclusion, Aunger found in favour of the critics. Kronfeldner is influenced by these arguments. While she has lucidly developed, integrated and expounded them and also engaged comprehensively with both older and more recent sources, adding new arguments of her own, it might appear that all she has done is rehammered the nails that should have held down the coffin lid on memetics and then added extra nails for good measure.

But the lid refuses to stay down. The corpse of memetics, unaware that it is dead, keeps rising to haunt the living. Although Susan Blackmore sounds more apologetic and the Journal of Memetics, which began in 1997, ceased publication in 2005, Daniel Dennett and Richard Dawkins still strut the international stage unashamedly promulgating these ideas, and other supporters have come to the fore. Marion Blute, a longtime proponent of memetics, published a defence in Darwinian Sociocultural Evolution: Solutions to Dilemmas in Cultural and Social Theory (Cambridge University Press, 2010). For this reason, a work such as Kronfeldner's was called for. She carefully details all the arguments for memetics over a range of disciplines where different formulations are given, designed to solve problems and meet criticisms. Her detailed conceptual analyses expose their ambiguities and incoherencies and systematically demolish them all.

Still, arguments against a scientific corpse would in themselves hardly make for exciting reading, even if the corpse is moving around amongst us. There is far more in the book than this, however. As the study of astrology is important to differentiate pseudo-science from genuine science, Kronfeldner has used the critique of memetics to clarify the proper use of analogy in science and the nature of scientific description, explanation and heuristics. Initial chapters describe the rise and evolution of Darwinian theory, showing how it provides explanations, how its alleged tautology can be avoided and how the theory evolved into the form embraced by Dawkins in which genes took the place of individual organisms as the units of variation and selection. She also describes the subtleties and refinements of neo-Darwinian theory and memetics, making every effort to do justice to their work. To expose the deficiencies in memetics, she defines the problem of accounting for novelty and change in culture and critiques efforts to account for this as the product of variation and selection. These efforts include Carl Hausman's theory of creativity in art, the evolutionary epistemology of Donald Campbell and Henri Poincaré's account of his own creativity in mathematics. While critically examining such work and exposing their conceptual confusions, ambiguities and fallacies, she also describes work advancing beyond the reductionist thinking of neo-Darwinism. In particular she describes work on human rationality, agency and creativity.

It is of major significance to not only grant a place to human creativity but also explain it. This provides an alternative explanatory model that can be generalized to other areas of biology. It is in fact a triumph of an alternative and older tradition of evolutionary theory which is holistic rather than reductionist. This is sometimes called holistic Darwinism, although its roots precede the work of Darwin. Developments in holistic Darwinism undermine the gene-centred evolutionary theory of the neo-Darwinists and thereby undermine memetics in a more fundamental way. The source of the analogy on which the dynamics of cultures is supposedly based has been shown by holistic Darwinists as too crude to comprehend biological evolution.

To begin with, holistic Darwinism acknowledges hierarchical ordering, the emergence of complex adaptive and anticipatory systems through the development of facilitative constraints, and the Baldwin effect in which selection is influenced by the exploratory activity and choices of organisms. If animals run from predators, they will be selected for speed at running; if they choose to fight, they will be selected for their capacity to fight. Giving a central place to the generation of form and the plasticity of this development, holistic Darwinism gives a place to genetic assimilation in which the differential capacity to develop in certain ways due to external stimuli, when exercised and influencing survival rates, leads to a concentration of genes in a population that result in the development becoming hereditary in individuals without the external stimuli. Combined with the Baldwin effect, genetic assimilation mimics Lamarckian evolution in which intention plays a central role in determining what evolves. Here genes are, as put by the theoretical biologist C.H. Waddington, merely pebbles in the concrete. Their place in evolution has become even more complex as it has been found that phenotypes do influence their own genes, with the DNA in chromosomes acting on other parts of the DNA, and organisms use the same string of DNA to produce different proteins. Furthermore, phenotypes are not merely selected in a particular environment but are actively involved in forming their environments, partly generating the niches within which they succeed or fail to survive.

All this is central to symbiosis and to ecosystems, the dynamics of which also have to be taken into account in evolutionary theory. Semiosis (the production and interpretation of signs in which each new interpretant itself becomes a sign), which operates at every level of living organization, further complicates the picture. Such complexity has led some biology theorists, notably Brian Goodwin and, more recently, Jerry Fodor and Massimo Piattelli-Palmarini, to call for the abandonment of Darwinism altogether in view of the very limited role random variation and selection actually play in evolution. Kronfeldner is clearly aware of such developments and refers to many of them, noting where Dawkins and other memeticists have attempted to respond to their arguments, but also pointing to where such work undermines memetic explanations. However, apparently concerned to be as charitable as possible to the proponents of memetics and to Dawkins in particular, she focuses on arguments surrounding the concept of memes in cultural evolution and makes no use of the arguments against neo-Darwinism in her argument against memetics.

However, holistic Darwinism enables memetics to be looked at in a new light. As a general theory of cultural evolution through variation and selection, memetics has to be rejected, along with neo-Darwinism, as a fundamentally defective theory. The vocabulary appropriate for the extension of evolutionary theory to humanity is provided by dissipative structures, hierarchical ordering, teleology, adaptive and anticipatory systems, morphogenesis and semiosis in all their great variety. Variation and selection of replicators have a subordinate place and can only be understood in the context defined by these broader categories; they cannot supply the foundational notions which could allow the wider concepts in all their significance and variety to be redefined and trivialized. Interpreted in this way, the corpse of memetics with its concept of memes might be better dealt with not by sealing it within a coffin of rational critique and disposing of it, but by recycling its concepts for more defensible ends. Memes can be redefined and used to study a limited domain, a domain that holistic Darwinists have always been uneasily aware of, the study of viruses.

Terrance Deacon, a holistic Darwinist barely mentioned by Kronfeldner, provides a starting point for this redefinition. Memes, he argues, like genes, are best interpreted as signs (or sign vehicles), as characterized by C.S. Peirce. As such, signs presuppose teleology and codes. They are enmeshed in hierarchical relations and there can be no question of variant replicators being selected for by processes decoupled from their internal structure. Rather than rejecting the term, Deacon argues that most semiotic approaches to life ignore what is involved in replication and perpetuation of signs, and the use of the notion of memes could bring this into focus. Most biosemioticians are already alive to this issue, however, and there is a better use for the notion of meme within this semiotic framework. In accordance with the work of biosemioticians, Deacon conjectures that life associated with proteins, and even RNA, preceded DNA, which was then utilized by organisms as a sign vehicle because it could function as a stable code. Taking DNA as the basis of life by neo-Darwinists amounts to a fixation on one level of semiosis, the code, ignoring the telos without which codes are not even codes. However, there is a case where this focus on one level seems at least partially justified, the case of viruses which are little more than strings of DNA (or RNA). It is in relation to viruses that neo-Darwinism sounds plausible, and when most people think of memes they think of viruses and the way they are reproduced and spread. Here it seems it is possible to think of fitness of a life-form as nothing more than the capacity for replication with slight variations which are differentially selected by other processes. Viruses, however, are not really life forms, but the detritus of life that contain the chemical basis of codes that are utilized in living semiosis. They have survived parasitically on life by corrupting living semiosis. They are diseases of life and their replication can only be understood in relation to it. If viruses are what come to mind when people think of memes, I suggest this is because there are phenomena associated with culture which play a similar role to viruses. Memes might be defined as cultural viruses.

What is a cultural virus? Like the DNA or RNA of viruses, cultural viruses have the form of interpretants without being interpretants and, as such, take the place of real interpretants and corrupt genuine semiosis. They are pseudo-signs, the detritus of intellectual life in which terms have come to be defined so that what is being claimed is a tautology, or close to being so, and is then taken to be a valid sign. A simple example is the claim that people act to maximize their pleasure and minimize their pain, where pleasure and pain are redefined as that which leads people to act the way they do. Such a claim gives people the illusion that they have some insight into people's motives while eliminating important distinctions, such as between people who are self-indulgent and people who quest after truth or justice. It colonizes people's minds and is proliferated because it gives this illusion of insight while enabling people to ignore such distinctions -- to excuse their egoism and disparage and exploit those who are not egoists.

A more complex example is neo-classical economics which is built on this simple tautology. While its elaborations make it more than a set of tautologies, what is promulgated through textbooks is little more than a set of tautologies. Again, this intellectual detritus gives the illusion of insight while blinding people to important distinctions. It reproduces through culture, taking the place of genuine social and economic research programs. Being little more than tautologies, it is very easy to present and understand, while genuine research programs are beset with complexities and uncertainties. It is then embraced because it excuses irresponsibility, self-indulgence and greed, absolves ordinary people from their responsibilities as citizens and legitimates the disempowerment of communities and employees, allowing plutocracies to dominate and corrupt governments to augment their wealth. Neoclassical economics as a cultural virus or meme is a disease of society, having facilitated such massive concentrations of wealth and income, the plundering of public assets and the privatization or corruption of public institutions that it has crippled the economies of nations, destroyed their capacity to govern themselves, and paralyzed humanity in the face of a global ecological crisis.

Neo-Darwinism, and its extension through memetics, has much in common with and supports neo-classical economics. It came very close to being tautological when it defined fitness as success in the struggle for survival and then used it to explain this success. To the extent that it was more than this, its achievements were very limited. The extension of neo-Darwinism by sociobiologists to include kinship relations highlighted its failures. Memetics was a product of and further development of sociobiology. Its core ideas are very easy to convey because in its crude form it is tautological, and beyond that it consists of comfortingly vague concepts with no descriptive, explanatory or heuristic power. It proliferates because it gives people the illusion of insight and absolves them from their responsibilities for the future (as Kronfeldner noted), excusing their egoism. The comprehensive exposure by Kronfeldner of the failure of memetics as a scientific theory has shown it to be itself nothing more than a cultural virus -- a meme.