Darwinian Populations and Natural Selection

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Peter Godfrey-Smith, Darwinian Populations and Natural Selection, Oxford UP, 2009, 207pp., $49.95 (hbk.), ISBN 9780199552047.

Reviewed by Massimo Pigliucci, City University of New York-Lehman College



Ever since the publication of Richard Dawkins’ The Selfish Gene, a book for the lay reader that popularized the ideas of influential evolutionary biologists like William Hamilton and George Williams, there has been much discussion of so-called “universal Darwinism”. Dawkins’ dual aim was to reduce evolutionary phenomena to the level of the gene, while at the same time abstracting the Darwinian process of natural selection of “replicators” and making it into something that would apply beyond the domain of biology. One of the most popular consequences of the latter approach is the birth of memetics, the study of rather fuzzily defined cultural replicators (the “memes”). Once the door was open for evolutionary biology to take over the social sciences and the humanities — as seen for instance in the attempt at cross-disciplinary colonialism articulated by E.O. Wilson in Consilience: The Unity of Knowledge — a host of both technical and lay publications have taken for granted the basic idea of universal Darwinism. Philosophers have not been immune to the fashion; a prominent example is Daniel Dennett, who in his Darwin’s Dangerous Idea referred to Darwinism as a “universal acid” which “eats through just about every traditional concept, and leaves in its wake a revolutionized world-view, with most of the old landmarks still recognizable, but transformed in fundamental ways.”

There is, of course, quite a bit of substance to all of the above. Dennett, for instance, is right in labeling Darwin’s insight as “dangerous” for the then status quo of Victorian science and society, and evolutionary theory is (rather surprisingly) still a threat to a large number of people who simply cannot accept the idea of being the result of chance and necessity and not of special divine creation. At a more technical level, it is also true that the principle of evolution by natural selection can be described in highly formalized ways, which therefore detach it from the specific biological substratum with which it happens to have been instantiated on planet earth. Perhaps the most compelling of such characterizations is the one given by Richard Lewontin in 1985, summarized in Peter Godfrey-Smith’s book, Darwinian Populations and Natural Selection (p. 18):

A sufficient mechanism for evolution by natural selection is contained in three propositions:

1. There is variation in morphological, physiological, and behavioral traits among members of a species (the principle of variation).

2. The variation is in part heritable, so that individuals resemble their relations more than they resemble unrelated individuals and, in particular, offspring resemble their parents (the principle of heredity).

3. Different variants leave different numbers of offspring either in immediate or remote generations (the principle of differential fitness).

In a paper published in 1983 in Evolution from Molecules to Man (edited by D. S. Bendal) and significantly entitled “Universal Darwinism”, Dawkins made the rather bold claim that something like the above conditions are not only necessary, but sufficient for the Darwinian process to take off, which means that we should expect any system, biological or not, and terrestrial or not, that displays those characteristics to evolve by natural selection.

Despite the clamor generated by universal Darwinists, there has long been a current of partial dissent concerning such matters among both evolutionary biologists and philosophers of science. This is not a question of rejecting the fundamental Darwinian insight, so no comfort need be taken by supporters of so-called “intelligent design” and other forms of creationism. Rather, it is an intellectual dissatisfaction with the Dawkinsian picture, which seems just a bit too simple and clear cut to be a realistic portrait of how the world actually works. The first and most convincing attacks have been aimed at the centrality of the gene, the starting point of Dawkins and colleagues’ construction. It has for instance been pointed out that genes are just one of many causal factors in the evolutionary process, and that by themselves they actually do not “do” anything at all. In some sense, of course, genes do “carry information” from one generation to another (they are “replicators” in Dawkins’ terminology), but information also comes from other components of the organism (in the form of epigenetic inheritance) and from the environment (which has led to the theory of niche construction in ecology). Few philosophers have pushed this line of criticism as far as denying a special role to genes altogether, but very good arguments have been made that genes have to share the limelight and cannot be thought of as any more crucial to the evolutionary process than several other factors.

The selfish gene paradigm has also been very effectively challenged, on both conceptual and empirical grounds, by the demonstration that natural selection can and does act at multiple levels (individual, group and species), not just the genetic one. Moreover, genes do not function in isolation inside the genome, but are enmeshed in highly complex webs of epistatic (gene-gene) interactions, which make the whole idea of a “selfish” genetic element rather unintelligible. (Dawkins has tried to bypass this problem by relegating other genes in a given genome to being part of a focal gene’s environment, a rather artificial and counterintuitive move that enormously complicates our understanding of what counts as an “environment”.) A consensus of sorts has emerged from these debates according to which genes can always be used as “bookkeepers” to track the evolutionary process, because whatever happens in the course of evolution eventually alters gene frequencies over time. But this is a far cry from thinking of genes as central to the process itself.

It is against this background that we need to situate Peter Godfrey-Smith’s new book. As the title clearly hints, Godfrey-Smith wishes to refocus our attention on the fact that evolution is, at core, a population-level phenomenon. As every evolutionary biologist learns in introductory courses, individuals survive and reproduce, but populations evolve. Accordingly, it is not by chance that population genetics is the cardinal discipline that provides the mathematical foundations for the so-called Modern Synthesis, the currently accepted version of Darwinism. Godfrey-Smith’s interesting and original twist is that we need a better and more comprehensive understanding of what, exactly, counts as a Darwinian population: the classical collection of individuals belonging to the same species and living in a particular geographic area? The ensemble of the genes encompassing a genome? The much broader “gene pool” of an entire species? Or even the species of organism that identify a particular phylogenetic clade?

Godfrey-Smith begins by defining what he means by a Darwinian population: “This is a population — a collection of particular things — that has the capacity to undergo evolution by natural selection. A ‘Darwinian individual’ is any member of such a population” (p. 6). The novelty of the approach is that the author immediately goes on to prepare the reader for the fact that in the course of the book one will encounter a family of Darwinian processes, some of which will involve what Godfrey-Smith calls “paradigm cases” while others are “marginal cases”. It is this idea of organizing Darwinian processes along a spectrum that eventually allows the author to tackle some of the most thorny issues of contemporary theoretical biology, from the major transitions in evolution (e.g., from unicellular to multicellular organisms) to the levels of selection debate, to the limits of ideas such as selfish genes and memetic replicators.

To get to that point, Godfrey-Smith introduces his readers to a multidimensional conceptual model aimed at both clarifying the complexity of evolutionary processes and fleshing out the above mentioned distinction between paradigm and marginal cases of Darwinian populations. We encounter several graphical representations of this conceptual space, the most important of which are found on p. 64 and p. 95. Let me briefly explore the first example, to give the reader a flavor of what Godfrey-Smith is after. Figure 3.1 in the book is a three-dimensional conceptual space defined by the following parameters: the fidelity of heredity, H; the dependence of realized fitness differences on intrinsic properties of the individual, S; and the continuity of the adaptive landscape on which evolution takes place, C. Let us be a bit more precise about each term defining the H-S-C heuristic space. H is a measure of how reliable the inheritance of an individual’s characteristics actually is. H cannot be zero, otherwise there is no parent-offspring correlation, and evolution cannot get started. S assesses to what degree variation in reproductive output within a population (a necessary condition for natural selection) is related to intrinsic (as opposed to extrinsic) features of the individuals making up the population. Godfrey-Smith is aware of the thorniness of philosophical discussions of “intrinsic” vs. “extrinsic” characteristics, but maintains that at its very basic the concepts are straightforward. So, for instance, the chemical composition of something is an intrinsic property, while being someone’s relative is an extrinsic property (because it depends on relations external to the individual). Finally, C is a measure of the smoothness of the fitness landscape: high C means that small changes in phenotype correspond to small changes in fitness (smooth landscape), while low values of C mean that small changes in phenotype correspond to jumps in adaptive space (rugged landscape).

Once we understand the H-S-C space (which, remember, is one of several conceptual subspaces defined by Godfrey-Smith) we can see how the author deploys it to explore the characteristics and limits of Darwinian processes. For instance, “paradigm” cases of evolution, i.e. those that most biologists would easily recognize as such, are found in the high-H / high-S / high-C corner of the diagram: the fidelity of replication is high, variation in fitness is dependent entirely on intrinsic properties, and the adaptive landscape is very smooth. In this corner, natural selection reigns supreme because the conditions for its operation are ideal. From there, however, Godfrey-Smith begins to examine what happens if one moves away from paradigm cases. Going toward low-H, for example, makes a population subject to an “error catastrophe” that will halt its evolution, because the heritability of individual features is no longer reliable. Moving toward low-C values increases the ruggedness of the adaptive landscape, and adaptive evolution is no longer possible (because small changes in phenotype will correspond to large and unpredictable jumps in fitness). The low-S / low-C area is governed by the process of stochastic drift rather than by natural selection, because variation in reproductive output depends largely on extrinsic characteristics and the landscape is rugged, and so on. Finally, the the 0-0-0 corner corresponds to very marginal (as opposed to paradigmatic) cases of evolution, since all three conditions are highly compromised.

Godfrey-Smith goes on to build additional spaces like these, based on a variety of additional conceptual parameters, the general idea being to identify under what conditions populations behave in a Darwinian manner and what one can say about evolutionary dynamics under a broad spectrum of circumstances. This multidimensional conceptual approach is then deployed in the latter parts of the book to consider in greater detail problems such as the above mentioned levels of selection (chapter 6), major evolutionary transitions (chapter 6), selfish genes (chapter 7) and memes (chapter 8).

The author’s discussion of the so-called “gene’s eye view” of evolution promulgated by Dawkins, Sterelny, Kitcher and others is much more nuanced than most. It is fairly clear that there are indeed selfish genetic elements, such as transposons and like molecular entities. Nevertheless it is also obvious at this point that the complexity of both molecular and organismal evolution simply cannot be captured satisfactorily by looking at things exclusively from the gene’s eye perspective. An interesting point made by Godfrey-Smith is that genes are not actually the long-lived, stable entities that Dawkins would like them to be in order to qualify as the “immortal replicators” at the center of the evolutionary stage. Phenomena like crossing-over (the splitting and recombining of chromosomes) do not respect genes’ boundaries, which means that the smallest functional units of heredity in most modern organisms are amino-acid coding triplets of nucleotides, not entire protein-coding genes (not to mention that many genes do not actually code for proteins at all, acting instead as regulatory elements modulating the action of other genes). Moreover, Godfrey-Smith makes an intricate argument, based on a well known hypothesis in molecular evolution focused on so-called intra-cell conflict, that genes are “late-comers [in evolution]. They are the products of complex evolutionary measures taken by cells to suppress what would otherwise be carnage at the chromosomal level” (p. 141). The details cannot possibly be explored here, but if Godfrey-Smith is right, genetic replicators are most certainly not a quintessential characteristic of the evolutionary process, a conclusion that dramatically undermines the utility of the gene’s eye view of evolution.

What about memes and cultural evolution? Here again Godfrey-Smith is subtle and balanced. He does recognize that there is a distinct possibility that some cultural processes have Darwinian features, but he states in no uncertain terms that “Darwinism is not likely to unify and transform the social sciences” (pp. 147-148). One of the major reasons for his skepticism of the Dawkins-Dennett position is that “Darwinian models of culture become less applicable as power relations [among human agents] become more asymmetric”, because societal-level networks of interactions make the society itself much less like a paradigmatic case of a Darwinian population (p. 149). Of course asymmetric power relations are extremely common in human societies (e.g., the success of a “meme” corresponding to a tune or the ideas presented in a book will have a lot to do with the kind of access to distribution and advertising that a recording or publishing company has at its disposal, and will not depend just on intrinsic characteristic of the “meme” itself — a case of low-S above). A further blow to the relevance of memetics is dealt by Godfrey-Smith when he points out that “once people combine too many sources of information and manipulate that information too intelligently, the phenomenon will vanish” because we will be in a low-H area in the multidimensional conceptual space discussed above (p. 160).

There are many subtle points in this short and dense book, and even grasping the broad picture will demand much attention from the reader. Still, Darwinian Populations and Natural Selection will be something to be reckoned with for anybody interested in the conceptual foundations of evolutionary theory and in the applicability of Darwinian ideas beyond the strict confines of biological evolution.