Darwinism as Religion: What Literature Tells Us About Evolution

Placeholder book cover

Michael Ruse, Darwinism as Religion: What Literature Tells Us About Evolution, Oxford University Press, 2017, 310pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190241025.

Reviewed by Ian Hesketh, The University of Queensland


Michael Ruse is a well-known authority in the history and philosophy of evolution, particularly that of Darwinism. While he is by training and self-identification a philosopher, his particular mode of philosophy is decidedly historical in the sense that his arguments are typically developed out of an engagement with historical evidence and narrative. His first book, The Darwinian Revolution (1979), is a wonderful example of his historical-philosophical method at work as he situated the sudden rise of Darwinian evolution within the particular social, cultural, and philosophical contexts of Victorian Britain. In Monad to Man (1996), Ruse extended his history of evolution into the twentieth century while exploring the centrality of progressivism in evolutionary thought, thereby highlighting some of the metaphysical issues that were essential to the popularization of evolution, and which were eventually suppressed by a professionalizing biology in the second half of the twentieth century. Darwin, of course, is the dominant figure in this book as well, with Ruse arguing that, in contrast to many modern assumptions about Darwinian evolution, progress was an important aspect of Darwin's whole scheme of evolution by natural selection. While several other of Ruse's books could be mentioned in this context, I think it is fruitful to think of his new book as continuing, deepening, and extending an argument about the central Darwinian nature of evolution that runs throughout these two earlier works. And, in its own way, it is equally important as these two now classic studies.

Before getting into the details, it is worth mentioning that Ruse's general thesis about the "Darwinian" revolution tends to run afoul of recent historiographical approaches to the subject. Part of the issue is that in recent years historians of science have sought to downplay the role of scientific heroes like Darwin in favor of lesser-known figures whose work was apparently more influential than previously thought. Bernard Lightman, for instance, has shown that many of the most popular writers of evolution in the Victorian period were motivated by and engaged with evolutionary theories produced not by Darwin but rather by Lamarck, by the anonymous author of the Vestiges of the Natural History of Creation (1844), or by Herbert Spencer.[1] And Lightman's work is complementary to the very anti-Rusean thesis put forward by Peter Bowler, who argues that Darwin's particular theory of evolution by natural selection was never really embraced by the vast majority of evolutionists, who preferred the more teleological and progressive theories produced by one or more of Darwin's competitors. It is better to think of the nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, Bowler argues, as defined by a "non-Darwinian Revolution," referring to the wide-acceptance of what he designates "developmental" theories of evolution at the expense of the specifically Darwinian.[2] In his more recent, counterfactual study, Bowler makes the bold claim that had Darwin died on his famous Beagle voyage, the science of evolution would have developed more or less as it did, if not quicker and much less contentiously.[3]

Understandably the author of the Darwinian Revolution is not a fan of the "non-Darwinian Revolution" (56, 67-68).[4] And Ruse's Darwinism as Religion can therefore be read as a challenge to this recent turn in the historiography of evolution as well as a defense of his own earlier studies. This is apparent from the book's opening pages, where Ruse states: "I shall argue that Darwin is a key figure in my story and thus, in this respect, there was absolutely, totally, and completely a 'Darwinian Revolution'" (x). But what sets this book apart from Ruse's previous studies of Darwinian evolution is that the evidence mobilized in defense of his thesis comes not from the writings, theories, and views of scientists, but from literature. As is announced in the subtitle, this is a book about what literature tells us about evolution. And by literature Ruse primarily means Anglophone novels and poetry, ranging from eighteenth-century figures such as Alexander Pope, Erasmus Darwin, and William Godwin, through to nineteenth-century writers such as George Eliot, Elizabeth Gaskell, Alfred Tennyson, and Emily Dickinson, and on to more recent authors such as William Golding, Ian McEwan, and Marilynne Robinson. These are just a few of the writers discussed in what is an incredibly wide-ranging analysis that foregrounds Ruse's uncanny ability to find relevant evolutionary meanings in seemingly innocuous passages of literature.

The conceptual apparatus is largely borrowed from Monad to Man, in which Ruse tracked the development of Darwinian evolution from a pseudoscience to a popular science to a professional science. The vast majority of the book, however, focuses on Darwinism as popular science, that is to say from the publishing of Darwin's Origin of Species in 1859 to the early twentieth century. What Ruse shows is that during this period many, many authors from a variety of religious and political perspectives, "wrestled" (a favorite metaphor of his) with the implications of Darwinian evolution because it necessarily undermined the stable world that had been made coherent and unambiguous by Christianity. It is in the realm of such literature, argues Ruse, that one gets at the extent to which evolution had permeated the popular imagination while gaining insight into the transformative impact Darwin had on human self-understanding.

So after establishing the singular contribution Darwin made to the development of evolution, Ruse explores the influence of that contribution on literature in chapters devoted to the respective themes of God, origins, humans, race and class, morality, sex, sin and redemption, and the future. By thoroughly naturalizing human origins, Darwin undermined the stability of meaning that had been provided by Christianity in all of these realms of thought. For the writer Thomas Hardy, for instance, an evolutionary perspective meant that humans were not God's favored creation, and therefore under His care and protection, but the mere products of nature, and therefore entirely under the subjection of its whims. This issue is explored in Tess of the D'Ubervilles (1892), which is about a woman, the title character, who is fundamentally a good person, although this does not save her from being imprisoned and then executed. Tess's moral intentions, therefore, are entirely divorced from her ultimate fate. For Ruse, this is one prominent interpretation of Darwinism, namely that "We are in a world of chance, of fate, where humans -- no matter their stunning beauty, their moral purity -- count for naught" (127). There is indeed a bleakness in Hardy's Darwinian universe. But, as Ruse argues, this was not necessarily the only way to live in Darwin's world.

The novelist Charles Kingsley, for one, found Darwinian evolution complementary to his Christian socialism. His popular Water Babies (1863) was a children's story about Tom, a chimney sweep who drowns and turns into a "water baby." Despite this degeneration, Tom again becomes human as he "slowly matures morally, learning to do things he does not like because they are the right thing to do" (90). Under Ruse's reading, therefore, The Water Babies is an evolutionary tale that is embedded in a larger narrative of Christian redemption. For Kingsley, Darwinian evolution could accommodate a moral scheme derived from Christianity, which helps explain why he was such an enthusiastic proponent of evolution.

Hardy and Kingsley represent opposite ends of a wide spectrum that includes a whole host of diverse responses to Darwinian evolution, from those advocating some sort of transcendental evolutionism such as Emily Dickinson to the deeply ambivalent "despair in the face of Godless nothingness" that was typical of Joseph Conrad (136). Darwin, Ruse argues, quite simply "changed our world," and this was the case "for those who agreed with him fully, for those who agreed with him but partially, and for those who rejected his thinking in various ways" (x). In other words, there was no escaping the Darwinian revolution for anyone, for proponents or critics alike who had to wrestle with the world that Darwin created.

If the vast literary responses to Darwinism convince Ruse of his original thesis about the pervasive nature of the Darwinian revolution, and therefore undermine any notion of a non-Darwinian revolution, he also wants to go beyond his original thesis, and this gets at the main title of the book. His foray into literature makes him realize that the Darwinian was not just a scientific revolution but also a revolution in how people understood themselves in relation to the world and the larger universe. It was therefore also a "religious revolution" as evolution, rather than Christianity, was now looked to in order to answer fundamental metaphysical questions, such as the meaning of life or the nature of God (281; see also 82). That Darwinism became a secular religion by ultimately replacing Christianity is a compelling and provocative claim. Moreover, Ruse uses the comparison of Darwinism to Christianity to great effect, particularly when he explains that the diversity of Darwinism was not unlike the variations that one finds within the realm of Christianity itself (see 87, 219 n. 7).

This book, then, effectively seeks to establish "Darwinism" as representative of a paradigm shift in worldview that occurs during the second half of the nineteenth century and the beginning of the twentieth century. Critics of this claim will no doubt argue that the evidence Ruse has mobilized in favor of this shift -- in the novels and poetry of the time -- leaves more room for interpretation than Ruse seems willing to acknowledge. Moreover, the quick pacing does not always lend itself to a careful analysis of the material, as Ruse clearly does not want to get bogged down by laboring a particular point or theme. An example of this occurs early on in a discussion of William Godwin's novel Things as They Are; or, The Adventures of Caleb Williams (1794), an analysis that is rather suddenly halted by the sentence "Enough!" (7). I read this as a humorous warning to readers that they should not expect extended summaries of plots or intricate deep readings of excerpted prose. But, as an authority no less than Dame Gillian Beer, author of Darwin's Plots,[5] points out on the back cover, this is not an academic book of literary criticism. What it is, rather, is "an intensely personal reading of deep questions that have preoccupied writers, and people at large, over the last hundred and fifty years." Indeed, Ruse's book  is an absolute joy to read and to ponder. It is a witty and, at times, polemical work that pursues a provocative and thought-provoking thesis that is by definition almost impossible to prove. To put it another way, it is a book that could have been written only by Michael Ruse. And that is indeed a good thing.

[1] Bernard Lightman, Victorian Popularizers of Science: Designing Nature for New Audiences (University of Chicago Press, 2007); Lightman, "Darwin and the Popularization of Evolution," Notes and Records of the Royal Society of London 64:1 (2010): 5-24; and Lightman (ed.), Global Spencerism: The Communication and Appropriation of a British Evolutionist (Brill, 2015).

[2] Peter Bowler, The Non-Darwinian Revolution: Reinterpreting a Historical Myth (Johns Hopkins University, 1988).

[3] Peter Bowler, Darwin Deleted: Imagining a World without Darwin (University of Chicago Press, 2013).

[4] See also Piers Hale, "Rejecting the Myth of the Non-Darwinian Revolution," Victorian Review 41:1 (Fall 2015), for a critique of the "non-Darwinian" concept.

[5] Gillian Beer, Darwin's Plots: Evolutionary Narrative in Darwin, George Eliot, and Nineteenth-Century Fiction (Cambridge University Press, 1983).