Darwinism & Philosophy

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Vittorio Hösle and Christian Illies (eds.), Darwinism & Philosophy, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 400pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0268030731.

Reviewed by Pieter Lemmens, Radboud University Nijmegen


Darwinism & Philosophy is a highly diverse and very interesting collection of essays on the philosophical implications of Darwinism, originating from a conference on this topic held at the University of Notre Dame, Indiana, USA, in March 2001. The authors explore, in a variety of ways, what 'Darwin's dangerous idea' (Daniel Dennett) entails for doing philosophy. With the introduction of Darwin's theory of natural selection, so it is widely believed, something very important occurred for philosophy, something that fundamentally shattered philosophy's traditional self understanding -- shattered in such a drastic sense that it has been forced to give up many of its time-honoured and cherished certainties and radically temper most of its original pretensions. This is of course true because Darwin's theory includes humans -- the entities practicing philosophy -- in its general account of the world. Humans, and therefore the human brains that are capable of philosophizing, are products of natural selection. The impact of Darwinism on philosophy should thus be far-reaching. But how far? And in what sense(s)?

There is still no consensus whatsoever on the exact philosophical consequences of Darwinism (naturalism of course representing one of the prime candidates) but, especially in the last few decades, it has become increasingly clear that Darwin's theory is not just a biological theory about the origin of species. The general idea of selection has proven much more fundamental, encompassing, according to some, not just living entities but many others as well. Some have even argued that Darwinism is a full-blown philosophical, i.e. metaphysical or ontological theory, since it concerns the whole of reality or, traditionally put, is a theory about 'being in general' (4). Darwinism itself, as stated by the editors, entails certain ontological commitments, certain tenets regarding the structure of reality, and if Darwinism is true, and there's ever more reason to think so, then some very far-reaching consequences for philosophy inevitably follow. The aim of this volume is to examine those consequences.

The book is unique not only because it is the first in its kind to offer such a wide ranging account of the influence of Darwinism on philosophy. There are three more reasons that make it a truly exceptional enterprise. First, it offers contributions by both philosophers and scientists. Second, it presents not only systematic analyses but also historical expositions. And third -- and most gratifying in my opinion -- it has taken the opportunity to include some highly distinguished 'continental' philosophers in its list of contributors. This last inclusion especially deserves praise because the philosophy of biology -- the discipline in which the debate on the philosophical consequences of Darwinism has been most prominent -- is largely dominated by Anglo-American philosophers. The names of the German philosophers Rupert Riedl, Dieter Wandschneider, Gerhard Vollmer, Marcel Weber, Bernd Graefrath, and Vittorio Hösle, and of the Dutch philosopher Christian Illies, familiar voices within their own language communities, are not very well known in the English-speaking world. An exception could be the French philosopher-historian Jean Gayon, whose name is more widely known among Anglo-Americans. This unusually broad selection of authors, of course, implies an enormous, if not overwhelming diversity of approaches and perspectives on the topic, resulting, as will become clear hereafter, in sometimes sharply divided opinions.

Apart from an introduction by the editors, the book is made up of four parts, each part addressing a specific question concerning the topic at hand. Part I discusses the scientific status of Darwinian biology and examines its ontological presuppositions. Part II considers the possibility of a non-naturalistic reading of Darwinism. Part III reflects on the epistemological relevance of Darwinism. Part IV, finally, asks about the place of man within the Darwinist framework. Each part is preceded by a short introduction on the topic and a synopsis of the arguments presented. In what follows, I will briefly touch upon all of the essays included in the book and give an extremely condensed -- and therefore highly simplified and grossly incomplete -- account of their main points, incidentally adding a critical note. As the authors say in their introduction, the analytic-Continental split is not bound up with the way in which both traditions have integrated and/or critically resisted Darwin's theory of natural selection or not. By any event, not one continental author figuring in this book seriously questions the core of Darwin's theory. Some continentals are ardent naturalists but a significant number of them are not, and if there is one distinguishing feature that sticks out among the continentals gathered in this volume, it would be a consequent idealist stance. One continental thinker especially, as I will show, highlights some interesting aspects of human evolution that, as far as I can see, are not very frequently taken into account -- in general -- within the mainstream Anglo-American tradition, although they are widely recognized in the continental tradition. I mean Dieter Wandschneider, whose idealistic take on human evolution is highly original and utterly fascinating to boot. He especially stresses the importance of consciousness, technology and culture in human evolution, through which man ultimately transcends nature. I will conclude this (inevitably) highly descriptive review with an overall opinion on the book.

Peter McLaughlin's article starts the first part of the book and asks what is specifically modern about modern science, by reflecting on the notions of actualism and materialism and their relationship. According to McLaughlin, neither Darwin's theory of evolution, an empirical theory, nor the facts of phylogeny and common descent, a historical reconstruction, have any metaphysical implications by themselves (15). These come into play only when combined with presuppositions like materialism (or naturalism) and actualism taken in a metaphysical sense, and not just methodologically, as is only required for the scientific quest. Nevertheless, generally speaking, Darwinian explanations giving natural causes for phenomena hitherto explained by supernatural causes do favour a naturalistic weltanschauung (27).

Historian of geology David Oldroyd, in an essay loaded with references, discusses the connections between Darwinism, paleontology and metaphysics, and argues that Lyell's actualism, which was the rival to Cuvier's catastrophism, was a theoretical conditio sine qua non for Darwin's theory of natural selection to work (as it needed huge amounts of time). Paleontology, and biology in general, can do fine without any metaphysics, according to Oldroyd, who believes that the only major metaphysical problem left is the origin of the universe (52).

Dutch philosopher Christian Illies analyzes the structure of selectionist explanations. He states that the principle of natural selection can be grasped in an a priori fashion and shows that its core principle -- 'the persistence of an entity depends upon its environment and upon its own properties' -- is not tautological, as is sometimes argued, but genuinely explanatory. The principle of natural selection is a priori true because it can be deduced from the principle of sufficient reason, provided that certain conditions hold (59).

Michael Ruse explores the relationship between Darwinism and naturalism and argues, through a reflection on the themes of miracles, the question of the existence of God, revealed religion, and the existence of man, that a Darwinian is necessarily committed to methodological naturalism but not to metaphysical naturalism (understood as materialistic atheism) (89).

In the very thoughtful final essay devoted to the scientific status and ontological implications of Darwinism, David Depew explores the shifting meanings of what he calls 'iconic Darwinism', i.e., the kind of (popular) images of Darwinism that circulate between scientific disciplines and in the public domain at large, for example Dawkins' image of the selfish gene or Mayr's idea of a genetic program. Depew warns against the dangers of becoming caught in so-called 'transcendental illusions' (in the Kantian sense) when grand interpretive frameworks are uncoupled, by philosophers like Daniel Dennett, from their origins in empirical findings and turned into a metaphysics that is then used to justify large inferences -- the alleged 'implications of Darwinism' -- on matters of behavior, mind, culture, society, religion, philosophy etc. 'Such inferences', says Depew, 'are always the work of preferred interpretive schemes' (96), that is, of favouring some interpretation at the cost of (equally plausible) alternatives. Depew instead argues for pluralism in the employment of conceptual schemes and stresses the necessity of maintaining a 'discursive space' for weighing the various, and often competing, schemes for interpreting Darwinism against one another. As he concludes, 'Versions of naturalism that collapse this space by demanding too much continuity between sciences and reflective discourses about it are as dangerous as versions of philosophy that insulate metaphysical, epistemological, and normative propositions from the deep insights of evolutionary science' (ibid.). Precisely as naturalists, Darwinists 'should reject the collapse of a naturalistic stance into a scientistic and metaphysical naturalism' (111). Naturalism's chief virtue, after all, consists in its staunch opposition to any kind of apriorism. In this essay, Depew explores some of the disputed issues in contemporary Darwinism (in particular: progress and agency), showing that Darwinism is a term that must be read in the plural.

Part II, 'Is a Non-Naturalistic Interpretation of Darwinism Possible', starts off with an essay in which Rupert Riedl gives an overview of his 'systems theory of evolution', a theory first proposed in his book Die Ordnung des Lebendigen: Systembedingungen der Evolution from 1975. One of the main features of this theory of evolving complexity is the centrality of the notion of 'recursive' or 'feedback' causality - 'the idea that every biological effect in living systems, in some way, feeds back to its own cause' (121). The concept of recursive causality can explain phenomena that defy explanation by plain linear causality, things like the continuing adaptability of complex systems, all kinds of developmental constraints, and macroevolutionary phenomena like parallel evolution, orthogenesis, and typogenesis. All of these phenomena, and many others, are shortly discussed in this essay. Riedl believes that inclusion of the concept of feedback causality within mainstream biology is of the highest importance. He even considers it as vital, in the long run, for our own survival as a species: the exclusive focus on linear causality is 'besides greed, the main cause of the environmental problem', as he concludes (141). Apparently, explicit awareness of the causal complexity of biosystems does not prevent one from monocausal -- or in this case: duocausal -- thinking in the cultural-historical domain. But it sounds like a plausible hypothesis, nonetheless.

Phillip R. Sloan focusses on Darwin's own concept of nature, which was not totally naturalistic, as he argues with Robert J. Richards. His thesis is that Darwin himself had 'an original formative philosophy of nature' (144), a complex understanding of nature that was highly influenced by the German tradition of Naturphilosophie, especially through the writings of Alexander von Humboldt. Although Darwin's view of nature was not fully teleological in an Aristotelian sense, it wasn't completely mechanical and 'nihilistic' either. His view of nature could be of help, as Sloan suggests, in smoothing the contemporary gap between 'is' and 'ought', that is, in reconsidering the status of the so-called naturalistic fallacy (159).

Robert J. Richards deals with the place of the concept of 'mind' in Darwinism. He argues that the conceptual grammar of Darwin's theory embodies a certain kind of metaphysics, reminiscent of ideas found in the works of Alexander von Humboldt and even effected by the views of such a speculative and idealist thinker as Friedrich Schelling. Richards proposes to defend the view that Darwin's theory was founded 'on something like a concept of absolute mind' (166.). He writes that 'from the beginning of his theorizing, Darwin employed mind as a model for understanding the evolutionary process' (172). The concept of mind was instrumental in the formation of Darwin's theory in that he sort of transferred all the powers of the divine -- omniscience, omnipotence, benevolence, creativity, and wisdom -- to nature itself -- i.e. to natural selection -- which is more or less the same as saying, according to Richards, 'that he came to conceive of nature as possessed of something like absolute mind' (ibid.). So mind, absolute mind, would have been Darwin's model for understanding evolution. He thought of selection not as a blind mechanical force but as some kind of intelligence (174), as a mental and intentional process (177). Yes, Darwin's original idea of evolution was progressive and goal-directed and as such metaphysical through and through. Only later, under the pressure of his critics, did he give up on the idealist assumptions that guided his theorizing. Our purely mechanical view of natural selection was not his. Darwin was not yet a neo-Darwinist (178).

The French historian and philosopher Jean Gayon examines the metaphysical implications of Darwinian evolutionary biology, by employing two different meanings of metaphysics, a 'negative' one derived from Comte (metaphysics as 'knowledge' based on mere verbal abstraction) and a 'positive' one derived from Kant, which in fact comprises four branches of knowledge: transcendental knowledge about the a priori conditions of any knowledge, special metaphysics or knowledge about things beyond experience (the totality of the world, God, the soul), the metaphysics of nature, and the metaphysics of morals. Taking these notions of metaphysics as a test case, he is then able to show that there are not many obvious metaphysical implications of Darwinism. However, there are a lot of obvious philosophical implications of Darwinism. This is because the central question of philosophy, following Kant, is 'What is man?'. And with respect to this question, it is hard for philosophy to ignore Darwinism (194).

A remarkable, intriguing essay 'On the Problem of Direction and Goal in Biological Evolution' comes from German philosopher Dieter Wandschneider. I think that his contribution is most typically 'continental', not only because it extensively refers to thinkers within the continental tradition, but because of the 'idealist' type of thinking that it pursues, in a more pronounced sense even than Hösle's paper. Wandschneider asks if there is a tendency to higher development in evolution and if so, whether man can be considered the goal of evolution. He further asks what could be the role of mind in this tendency. He concludes his meditations with a reflection on the anthropological and the metaphysical implications of the answers to these questions (197). He first distinguishes between 'horizontal' evolution, the occupation of available biospheres, and 'vertical' evolution, the creation of new biospheres, and characterizes the last mentioned as the 'self-upgrading of nature' (199). This 'self-upgrading' towards greater complexity betrays a certain kind of goal-directedness implicit in the ideal structure of Darwinian evolution (201). Essentially, development towards higher complexity involves two principal tendencies: cognition and self-thematization (203). With the appearance of self-awareness in humans, of the human mind, the development of technology becomes possible, on the one hand freeing man from natural constraints, on the other hand opening the possibility to oppose nature. This gives culture, an artificial, second nature ensuing from the separation of man from nature and his simultaneous self-authorization. This yields a being, man, essentially freed from nature and as such it can be said that man is the end, the apotheosis of natural evolution (204). He is, in a sense, really the 'crown of creation' (natural selection being the creator here). From now on, cultural selection comes to replace natural selection. Man becomes the self-domesticating animal. At this point, the Hegelian in Wandschneider rears its head. He asks: 'If the goal of natural selection is the evolution of mind, and if mind is the negation of naturalness, then is not the goal of natural evolution the negation of naturalness?' (206). Of course, according to Wandschneider this is true. With man as the animal rationale, nature has produced a being capable of transcending nature, understanding it, and altering it technologically on the basis of this understanding. Almost quoting Schelling, he writes: 'it can also be said that with man nature, as it were, gains consciousness of itself' (208). If this isn't idealism, what else is? The human mind is not only an unnatural but, even more, a supernatural entity that possesses the possibility of both completing and elevating nature (ibid.). Anthropologically, man's emancipation from nature implies that he is both capable of error, in that his instincts don't guide him anymore, and guilt: lacking instinct, human behavior is not automatically correct (209). Metaphysically, Wandschneider opts for the view that the laws of nature possess an ideal character and this ideal, this logic, underlies all natural being (211). It is a logic that we humans are capable of knowing. 'All in all', as Wandschneider concludes, 'this points to an (objective) idealistic ontology of nature. Mind you: objective here designates an idealism not of a Berkeleyan but of a Hegelian type, for which there are, I think, good reasons and to which we owe probably the most well-thought-out philosophical concept of nature that occidental philosophy has brought forth' (ibid.). Darwinism makes visible the immanent logic of nature, of which Darwinism itself is a product. So, in the end, Darwinism and idealism are not only compatible but intimately connected. I suppose that this bold conclusion raised some eyebrows among the Anglo-American naturalists attending the conference.

The German Hegelian Vittorio Hösle explores the compatibility of Darwinism with objective idealism and questions the implicit naturalist character of Darwinism. For him, it is not only 'logically possible' to be both a Darwinian and an objective idealist or Platonist, it is 'even a wise choice' to be one (217). Hösle wants to show that his own -- Hegel-inspired -- objective-idealist worldview is perfectly compatible with everything that Darwinian evolutionary biology has told us about the living world. What he in fact 'only' does, here, is show that 'nothing in Darwinism confutes an objective-idealist stance with regard to the ideas of the true, the good, and the beautiful' (224). He thinks epistemology, ethics, and aesthetics could gain a lot by assimilating the insights of Darwinian evolutionary theory, but he is unconvinced that a new, evolutionary epistemology -- or ethics or aesthetics -- should somehow replace the -- according to Hösle -- one and only true conception of the nature of truth, goodness and beauty, which is, of course, objective idealism. Evolutionary epistemology can teach us a lot about how knowledge is actually acquired, it cannot be of much help, however, in answering the normative question of why truth-claims are true (225). Ultimately, as Hösle suggests in a truly Hegelian fashion, 'it is possible to interpret the evolution of life as the slow and gradual process of the implementation in the material world of the ideas of the true, the good, and the beautiful' (236). He states, echoing Wandschneider, that in the end, Darwin's greatness lies in nothing less than the discovery of the 'very rational mechanism' of the living realm, 'the metaprinciple that is at the root of all concrete adaptations' (237). In his discussion of ethics, Hösle gives some very interesting, uncommon thoughts to sociobiology.

Part III of the book, then, proceeds by explicitly discussing the epistemological relevance of Darwinism. Michael T. Ghiselin recapitulates his famous thesis that species, Darwinistically conceived, are individuals (and not classes). The revolutionary character of Darwin's theory precisely consists in having shown the crucial importance of the individual for our understanding of what life is (245). From an ontological point of view, species are individuals and this means that they don't have essences. It also means that things like 'laws of nature' do not apply to them. The physical laws of nature, of course, do play an important role in the process of evolution but the existence and identity of species can only be explained historically. Biological, i.e., adaptive explanations have the character of historical narratives (251). Ghiselin criticizes Dennett's algorithmic, 'Panglossian' idea of adaptive evolution for not recognizing this general truth. He accuses it of having a false, ahistorical conception of adaptation, as if adaptation could somehow be deduced from general principles or laws. Such a view is, moreover, secretively teleological (252). As for the Darwinian perspective on knowledge, Ghiselin argues that it resolutely rejects idealism and the strict dualism between subject and object that idealism entails, because Darwinism integrates the knowing subject firmly within the 'objective', materialist world. He calls his own position 'monistic', implying the affirmation of the unity of the cosmos and the unit of knowledge. And he hates 'pluralism'-- which he renames 'syncretism' -- in matters of philosophy (256). Ghiselin especially dislikes authors who continue to claim that species are 'sets' on the basis of logical reasoning alone: 'The logical apparatus that serves as the metaphysical basis for their epistemology gets treated as if it told us something about ontology' (ibid.).

Gerhard Vollmer recalls the fundamentals of his evolutionary epistemology, advances some new arguments in favour of it, and counters some familiar objections. Most implications of Darwinism are antimetaphysical, he writes, and its philosophical consequences strongly tend toward naturalism and realism. A crucial observation is that evolutionary epistemology hinges on the idea of natural selection, so that it is extremely relevant for it to know how effective natural selection as an evolutionary factor is (271). But, as he shows, there is enough evidence to hold that natural selection has far more explanatory power than non-selectionist theories of evolution. One of the things Vollmer tries to do here to some extent is show the close interconnectedness and mutual supportiveness of evolutionary epistemology, naturalism, realism, evolutionary theory, the development of science and an evolutionary philosophy of science (along the lines of David Hull).

In a very technical essay entitled 'Darwinism as a Theory for Finite Beings', Marcel Weber reflects on the theoretical status of chance -- or probability -- and determinism in the Darwinist theory of evolution. His central question is the following: 'Do biologists use the concept of probability because they are finite cognitive agents or because the evolutionary process is fundamentally probabilistic?' (276). Weber's answer, after reviewing the various evolutionary contexts in which chance and probability appear, and after a critical assessment of the instrumentalist (Alex Rosenberg) and realist (Robert Brandon and Scott Carson) accounts of the statistical nature of evolutionary theory and suggesting an alternative of his own, is that we just can't tell, on the basis of present knowledge. His final position on the question of determinism versus indeterminism in evolution is therefore agnostic. Given this fundamental uncertainty, any account of the statistical nature of evolutionary theory is ipso facto incomplete. And no additional metaphysical inquiry will be of help here. Only empirical findings could bring us further in this matter. On the premise of determinism, we have to admit that the statistical nature of evolutionary theory is a reflection of our cognitive limitations. But this does not condemn us to instrumentalism because there are objective interpretations of probability possible -- e.g. Weber's own proposal -- that are compatible with determinism. Ultimately, evolutionary theory reveals the finite nature of human cognition in the use of concepts like chance and probability, yet we don't know exactly what they mean (295).

Part IV, finally, considers the place of man within a Darwinian perspective. In a long contribution, by far the longest of the book, sociobiologist Richard D. Alexander dwells at length on the possibility of a biological explanation of traits uniquely human, in particular art. That human traits like artistic behavior are unique in the living world does not mean that there is no possible biological explanation for them. And a biological explanation since Darwin is by definition a selectionist explanation. But is it really possible that reproductive success, the only thing that counts in evolution, is the one and only principle underlying all the incredibly diverse and infinitely strange types of behavior that characterize the uniqueness of the human species? Does there really exist an essential 'connection between a fundamental reproductive motivation and the cathedrals of cultural splendour that have been generated across human history', Alexander asks (310). He himself definitely thinks so. Basically, what he tries to show in his detailed analyses is that all kinds of evolutionary social selection mechanisms, including so-called nepotistic selection and mutualistic and reciprocity selection, 'may be the last important set of mechanisms required for the connecting of complex aspects of cultural phenomena, such as the arts, to a life basis in evolutionary selection favoring reproductive success' (345). Alexander thinks that the problem for sociobiological explanation is not a lack of possible mechanisms to approach our own behaviors but ignorance as to how to make use of those mechanisms (ibid.). His essay at least does provide some interesting suggestions.

Next is a very interesting essay by Lenny Moss. His contribution is an attack on what he calls 'vulgar Darwinism', the kind of Darwinism that describes some kind of genetic algorithm -- the logic of replicators (think of Dawkins and Dennett) -- as the basis of the evolutionary dynamic while denying any agency to the organisms themselves, just as vulgar marxists used to deny the importance of individual action in favour of the 'iron laws' of dialectical materialism supposedly governing the course of history. According to vulgar Darwinism, the two central processes of evolution, variation and selection, occur in complete independence from the organism. Only genes are thought to behave like active agents, while organisms appear as passive vehicles (Dawkins) molded by the genes and the environment. Moss shows that this genocentric view is incorrect. In doing so, he introduces a very helpful distinction between two kinds of genes, each playing completely different explanatory roles. A gene P is a 'gene for X' and refers to what Moss calls a 'phenotype predictor'. 'P' stands for 'preformationist', but in an 'as-if' sense, as if it were responsible, all by itself, for the production of some phenotypic feature X. An example would be the 'gene for blue eyes', which of course does not exist in the sense of an autonomous blue-eye producer but only as one tiny sequence needed in the biochemical route that leads to the production of brown eyes. Absence of this blue-eye gene P, coding for a particular pigment, results in blue eyes. Genes P are thus to be taken in an instrumental sense. Genes D, however, are particular molecular sequences that act as a developmental resource (therefore the 'D') but are indeterminate with respect to a phenotype. Genes D are used in epigenetic explanations, i.e., in describing the complex biochemical routes leading toward phenotypes (353-4). Moss goes on to show that the 'meaning' of changes in the DNA is not determined by the DNA-sequence as such but by the adaptive developmental potential of the organism, which means, ultimately, that it's not the genes but the organism itself that occupies 'the evolutionary driver's seat' (358).

German philosopher Bernd Graefrath concludes this volume with an essay on the impact of Darwinism on our thinking about ethics and normativity. He argues that, while evolutionary biology may explain human behavior, this does not imply that it also justifies that behavior. There is an essential difference between explanation and justification. We cannot proceed from 'is' to 'ought' without an extra justification, that is, if we are to avoid the so-called 'naturalistic fallacy' (370). But if justifications are grounded in 'basic intuitions', as John Rawls has argued, why shouldn't those intuitions, in the final analysis, be some kind of 'feelings' caused by evolutionary processes and therefore explainable by evolutionary biology? (371). If it can be shown that our moral dispositions are somehow derivative of an emotional make-up that evolved by natural selection, then this surely has consequences for their moral status, as Graefrath argues, quoting Jeffrey G. Murphy (372). In the second part of his essay, Graefrath argues that, morally speaking, a Darwinist worldview that stresses the continuity between man and animal could alter our relationship to other animals for the better. For if we think of pain, or sentience more generally, as being a morally relevant factor, then why deny this moral qualification to animals? Why not 'expand the circle' (Peter Singer) of our moral concern on this grounds? (374).

In conclusion, I would say that this book represents a state of the art assessment of the implications of Darwinism for the philosophical enterprise. All in all, it is quite a marathon to read through the whole book, a marathon, that is, with many, sometimes completely different, trajectories. As we can infer from the plurality of approaches presented in it, there is no general consensus on what Darwinism should imply for philosophical theorizing. For instance, some argue that Darwinism is committed to naturalism, while others hold that it is compatible with or even necessarily leading to some form of idealism. Some judge its metaphysical implications as being far-reaching, while others consider them negligible. Things sometimes depend, or so it seems, on the philosophical position one already endorses and on the tradition in which one is educated. There is only one thing that I missed while reading the book and that was attention to alternative, non-Darwinist accounts of biological evolution. It seems to me that such alternative theories could have some non-trivial implications for Darwinism.