Dasein Disclosed: John Haugeland's Heidegger

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John Haugeland, Dasein Disclosed: John Haugeland's Heidegger, Joseph Rouse (ed.), Harvard University Press, 2013, xl + 291pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674072111.

Reviewed by Thomas Nenon, University of Memphis


This unusually structured book is centered around John Haugeland's highly original, thoughtful, and thought-provoking interpretations of Martin Heidegger's Being and Time. The unusual structure is the result of Haugeland's untimely death and the laudable efforts of Joseph Rouse. Rouse has gathered together two of Haugeland's early publications on Heidegger; a fellowship proposal to write a book on Heidegger; a lengthy and incomplete commentary on the First Division of Being and Time; and several later essays centered primarily around themes from the Second Division including ownedness (more commonly called authenticity), death, and temporality. These are followed by articles on issues in contemporary philosophy that do not explicitly discuss Heidegger but are consistent with the positions Haugeland had developed through his readings of Heidegger. This organization allows the reader to follow the evolution of Haugeland'sreadings of Heidegger over two decades. But it also leads to a great deal of repetition as Haugeland rehearses many of his most basic insights about the First Division in slightly different ways to set up his interpretations of the Second Division and to introduce some of Heidegger's positions in slightly different ways to different audiences and on different occasions.

It becomes clear from the outset that Haugeland's primary interest is not nearly as much Heidegger's texts in themselves as what he sees as the important and original insights about fundamental issues in ontology, epistemology, philosophy of language, and philosophy of mind that can be found in Heidegger's early work. So even in the extended commentary on the First Division of Being and Time that comprises the book's core, Haugeland is selective in the choice of the concepts and passages that he presents and explains. His intent is not to produce a line-by-line or even section-by-section analysis, but rather to concentrate on those passages that present and explain what he sees as Heidegger's most important insights. Rouse notes in the "Editor's Introduction" that "Haugeland intended the manuscript he was writing under the title Dasein Disclosed as a careful philosophical reading of Heidegger's project rather than a commentary on his texts" (ix).

Haugeland himself was trained and active in the "analytic" Anglo-American tradition and so the issues he identifies in several of his essays are treated in terms of the ideas of thinkers such as Goodman, Quine, Kripke, and Brandom. But what he finds lacking in their work can be generally characterized as an unquestioned Cartesian legacy. That is why the general positions Haugeland espouses have just as much relevance within the Continental tradition as well. From the Continental perspective, one could describe Haugeland's readings as "phenomenological" in the best sense, namely as orientated on the issues or "things themselves" that the reader assumes the text is attempting to address. This orientation toward the issues at stake in the text -- more than just the text itself -- is especially apt in the case of Heidegger, since it is consistent with what Heidegger understood as phenomenological reading and what he took himself to be practicing in his readings of major figures from the history of philosophy (even though some self-proclaimed Heideggerians fall short of this standard when they approach the master's texts).

Haugeland's reading is remarkably free from technical analytic terms. Wherever possible, he uses everyday terms and commonplace examples. He cites Heidegger's examples of using equipment like hammers and nails, streets and cars, but he also adds a few of his own like playing chess or doing modern experimental physics. That does not mean that the book is always easy to read. Heidegger took everyday words in German and stretched them, putting them into new contexts and turning them into technical philosophical terms (a practice Heidegger thinks he has borrowed from Aristotle). Haugeland does the same thing with everyday terms in English in his attempt to explain Heidegger's texts. The result in Heidegger's original German is a vocabulary that is a bit strange, sometimes puzzling, but often strongly evocative. In all of the English translations up until now (including Haugeland's renderings, which are not intended strictly as translations), the result loses almost all of its evocative power and occasionally presents a challenge to any reader. Orthodox Heideggerians, who have now become more or less comfortable with the standard Macquarrie and Robinson translations will find Haugeland's original renderings off-putting in some cases and perhaps find reasons to object to some of them, just as they have found many reasons to object to many of the more traditional translations. New readers will find them not much more, but probably not a lot less, hard to follow than other interpretations using what have now become the more traditional translations. The passages in which Haugeland strings together long sequences of such terms are thankfully not as frequent as they are in Heidegger's text or in many other books about him.

At first glance, the opening essay may seem to be the most violent, to use Heidegger's term, or -- as Haugeland himself says -- the most "nonstandard and rather freewheeling interpretation" (3). Asking "What is a person?", he turns to the question of behavioral dispositions or norms as commonly accepted ways of responding to the circumstances in which one finds oneself. He takesDasein to be comprehensible not first and foremost in terms of individuality, but rather as a way of living, a way of understanding the world that makes sense of individual objects in the world, entities, in terms of the right and wrong ways to deal with them. Seeing an entity -- be it a hammer or a pawn in a chess game -- is above all recognizing what to do with it against the backdrop of these norms so that "all constitution is institution" (8), i.e., takes place against the backdrop of the socially established norms.

This is less of a leap from Heidegger's own positions in Being and Time than it might seem at first glance. The default mode of being-a-self, we learn in the First Division of that work, is "das Man," the anyone, everyone, (and no one) that we all understand and participate in. Haugeland's certainly nonstandard way of putting the point is that human beings are "conformists," members of communities that each involve "not just imitativeness (monkey see, monkey do), but also censoriousness -- that is a positive tendency to see that one's neighbors do likewise and to suppress variation" (4). This is a point that goes beyond what Heidegger actually says, but it does make sense when one realizes that the opinions everyone in a community shares are not primarily matters of factual information but above all shared views about the right and wrong way to do things. "Norms" in this broad sense set the parameters of proper and improper moves not just in formalized games like chess as a set of rules for how to move pieces across the board, but in other contexts with interdependent roles like all of the uses of tools in building a house, repairing a car, or the interrelated sets of behaviors governing institutions like "General Motors, marriage, and the common law" (10). What we are, then, are most originally members of communities with common expectations about how one is to behave in various settings. Haugeland then says that individual instances of Dasein are "units of accountability" (11) that are not bare individuals but agents that fulfill social assignments and roles more or less well, more or less appropriately interacting with others (what we traditionally called "subjects") and entities within the world (traditionally "objects").

He also notes that this opens up the possibility of self-accountability in assessing one's own behavior against the backdrop of the shared understandings of how to do things and the shared norms of the community. He further notes that such self-assessment would normally arise whenever the norms of the various communities of which I am a member come into tension or conflict with one another.

All self-critical adjudication is among current roles. In terms of the whole, some may be rejected, other adjusted, but there is no external or higher standard against which all are judged. The only end is self-constancy -- a clearer, more coherent self-understanding ability to be me (14).

They can take the explicit form of utterances because one of the accomplishments of such communities is also a shared language. To be an "owned" self would then be a self that consciously takes ownership of its behaviors and of the way it responds to those norms. This notion of "ownedness" as Haugeland's early reconstruction of Heideggerian authenticity is clearly Haugeland'sand not Heidegger's when he says that "self-critical adjudication is among current roles." Haugeland will later modify this view and bring it into closer alignment with Heidegger's, as we will see below.

The second essay on "disclosedness" (Heidegger's Erschlossenheit) covers some of the same terrain, but follows much more closely the line of Heidegger's own text that begins by asking how entities normally show up for us in our daily lives. Haugeland's leading example is chess pieces that can be made sense of only in terms of how they can be used when playing chess. He establishes a loose connection between Davidson's notion of "rational norms" and Heidegger's insights by noting that we make sense of entities against the backdrop of an understanding of the proper uses, their "availability" (Haugeland's translation of Bewandtnis or "relevance") for certain purposes, what Heidegger calls "possibilities of Dasein." Here too Haugeland stresses the social origin of the understanding of such possibilities when he asserts that something "actually plays a role if, according to the customs and practices of a community, it is taken to play that role. Availability is the way of equipmental being" (25). He calls these customs and norms "an institutional framework." A prime example of an institutional framework is "language." But we need to realize that availability is often recognized prior to any linguistic formulation since institutional norms are "comparably inarticulate and inconspicuous" compared to the norms and rules of baseball or chess (27).

These institutional frameworks of norms, rules, and roles are what Haugeland thinks Heidegger is aiming at through the notion of a "world." Worlds necessarily involve not only entities but also accountable agents whose behaviors establish and reinforce or undermine those norms. Individual lives are always evaluated against a shared understanding of a way of life, according toHaugeland: "In fact, an idio-way-of-life is nothing other than the peculiar integration and adjustment of various 'public' ways of life as idiosyncratically adopted and lived by one person" (32). So individual cases of Dasein are ways of integrating themselves into these commonly instituted and understood ways of living. They provide the backdrop for our everyday dealings with objects -- "making sense of them," as he puts it in this essay. But he says much less about how we make sense of "others" than he does about making sense of ourselves and the entities that surround us.

In the fellowship proposal, Haugeland's take on ownedness comes closer to his later reading that everyday Dasein can find itself in a position where the commonly shared norms break down and lead an individual "to relinquish that whole way of life. To accept this issue as a personal possibility is to take over responsibility for that dasein and, in that sense, make it one's own" (45). There is no indication that the options available to such an individual are limited to those commonly available within the previous framework that has broken down.

Haugeland's longer commentary on the First Division develops the themes broached in the first two essays much more extensively and in a terminology much closer to Heidegger's own. Dasein, he says, "is a way of living that embodies an understanding of being" (81-82), and "these understandings of being are 'embodied' primarily in how we live" (82). He cites Heidegger's conception of co-Dasein as evidence that Heidegger too shares his position on Dasein as essentially communal: "Clearly, it must mean at least this: to be a person at all is to be a coparticipant in a way of life that embodies an understanding of being -- in other words, a fellow member of the community whose way of life that is" (125). Otherwise the reading follows fairly well-known paths and breaks off before the end of the First Division.

Haugeland's most original contribution is his reading of the Second Division as he reverses course and states emphatically that "Dasein's possible ownedness ('authenticity') . . . cannot be understood in social-normative terms at all" (182). Instead, he compares it to the difference between standard science and paradigm shifts in a Kuhnian sense. Everyday science is a framework within which empirical science discovers "ontical truths" about the objects it studies, but when a science breaks down, the question of the appropriateness of the framework itself, its "ontological truth" arises. Commitment to the framework involves a way of responding, a responsiveness to the entities as they show themselves within it, a kind of "responsibility" that is the opposite of epistemological relativism. But when things begin to show up in ways that undermine the framework itself, this calls for an entirely new way of looking at things, a new framework for which Dasein itself must take responsibility. Similarly, public understandings of the priorities for a life mask the fact that each case of Dasein can and must take responsibility for its life as a whole (208). This is what Haugeland thinks Heidegger means by the "call of conscience" and by "resolute Dasein" when an individual embraces this possibility of "taking over responsibility for itswhole self" (209), just like the scientist who, pioneering a new way of thinking of things within a science, charts out a new course out of a sense of responsibility to "getting things right" when everyday science has broken down.

There is much to be said for this analogy, but in some ways it is closer to the position of the later Husserl than the early Heidegger.[1] In his conception of the "life-world," Husserl comes to see how each individual's default beliefs, values, and practices derive from a sedimented communal understanding and that "authentically egoic acts" take place only against the backdrop of these historically evolved and shared beliefs, values, and practices.[2] Moreover, he thinks that part of the structure of reason is that not only beliefs but also values and practical decisions, even our most basic priorities and values, can be confirmed or disconfirmed through experience as correct or incorrect. In the years immediately preceding Being and Time, Heidegger explicitly contests this view and says that this scientific model of truth is unsuited to what at that stage he calls "the truth of art and religion,"[3] or what he will call in Being and Time the grounding of the Worumwillen or the fundamental priorities for a life. Hence his talk of Dasein as a "groundless ground."[4] So although there is much to say in favor of Haugeland's position, and although it shares much in common with Heidegger's position on this basic issue, it is important to be clear here that this provocative and thoughtful analysis is Haugeland's more than Heiddegger's. The clarity with which it is presented makes it a very worthwhile reading nonetheless.

[1] On the contrast between Husserl and Heidegger on this issue, see Thomas Nenon, “Martin Heidegger and the Grounding of Ethics,” in L. Embree and T. Nenon (eds.), Husserl’s Ideen  (Dordrecht: Springer 2013), pp. 175-193.

[2] See Thomas Nenon, “Intersubjectivity, Interculturality, and Realities in Husserl’s Research Manuscripts on the Life-World (Hua XXXIX),” forthcoming in R. Jensen and D. Moran (eds.),  Embodied Subjectivity (Dordrecht: Springer, 2013).

[3] Martin Heidegger, Einführung in die phänomenologische Forschung. Vorlesung 1923-24. Gesamtausgabe Vol. 17 (Frankfurt M./ Klostermann 1994), p. 98.

[4] Cf. Martin Heidegger, Sein und Zeit (Stuttgart: Niemeyer, 1972), p. 285.  The page numbers from the German original are listed in the margins of the English translations of this work.