David Armstrong

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Stephen Mumford, David Armstrong, Acumen, 2007, 206pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651009.

Reviewed by Alexander Bird, University of Bristol


One obvious task for an introductory text concerning the work of a particular philosopher is to express the central ideas of that philosopher in as clear a manner as possible. When it comes to several recent and contemporary philosophers, this task, I am pleased to say, presents something of a challenge, precisely because the source material is itself already so perspicuous. This is especially true of the work of David Armstrong. Why, one might think, would one recommend someone else's writing on Armstrong when one could recommend reading Armstrong himself?

This is, nonetheless, a challenge to which Mumford rises with great success. He manages to condense Armstrong's thinking while maintaining (or even improving on) the clarity of the original. Of course, the perspicuous presentation of the target's arguments is not all that such a book can or should do. It should also aim to chart the development of its subject's thought, to delineate and explain its unity, where that exists, and to introduce the reader to the principal criticisms and debates. Mumford performs these tasks very effectively, with an open admiration for Armstrong's work, yet with an honest appraisal of the objections it faces. In the latter, Mumford mirrors Armstrong's own openness to criticism and pleasure in philosophical debate.

Armstrong is a systematic thinker. A key theme in Mumford's book is Armstrong's naturalism. The latter is, to start with, a commitment to providing a metaphysics suitable for natural science. A sense that the needs of science, of physics in particular, should not only constrain, but also, in a very general way, direct our metaphysics is much more palpable in Armstrong's work than it is in the work of David Lewis. This becomes clear in the more specific articulation of naturalism as the claim that all that there is is contained within the (one and only) spacetime system. As such this looks like a straight metaphysical thesis for which there should be straight metaphysical arguments. Mumford makes clear that naturalism is distinct from the epistemological thesis of empiricism, here understood as the thesis that knowledge of existence is a posteriori (so the existence of universals is not decided a priori but by empirical science). Yet, as Mumford also brings out, the argument for naturalism proceeds by appeal to the Eleatic principle that we can never have good reason to believe in anything that has no causal power. In which case, naturalism takes on an epistemological character after all.

A different question for Armstrong's naturalism asks about its own status. Is the appeal to 'the spacetime system' itself an inevitable part of physics? Would the commitment to naturalism change if what we think of as the spacetime system turns out itself to have evolved from something quite different? It is not obvious that a final theory of everything will have to have spacetime as a fundamental entity. Likewise, turning to the Eleatic principle, it is not obvious that we should expect to find causation at the level of fundamental physics, and indeed the lesson many take from quantum entanglement and other phenomena is that causation is a macro-phenomenon. One may speculate that Armstrong would go with whatever the physics tells us. Mumford distinguishes physicalism from naturalism, since physicalism is the claim that all there is in the spacetime system are physical things governed by physical laws. We can accept things that physics does not talk about directly so long as these are reducible to the physical things -- as such they are an ontological free lunch. So Armstrong takes this as requiring, on the one hand, the reduction of intentional mental states and, on the other hand, the elimination of numbers, possible worlds, and supernatural beings. One might wonder why one could not let through the existence of numbers and sets as an extreme case of an ontological free lunch -- the free lunch one gets with absolutely everything (and nothing).

Armstrong's naturalism and use of the Eleatic principle crop up in a number of places -- for example in the rejection of Platonic, transcendent realism about universals. For my money the problem of transcendence -- how such a universal engages with the particulars bearing the property in question -- is no worse than the problem faced by the Aristotelian, immanent realist, in explaining how one item can be multiply located. Armstrong's naturalism makes the latter a lesser crime.

After expositing Armstrong's view of universals, Mumford moves naturally on to the laws of nature. A central part of his metaphysics, Armstrong's nomic necessitation view of laws has received many attacks, initially from defenders of Humean regularity views (who had had things all their own way until Armstrong, Dretske, and Tooley came onto the scene) and more recently from proponents of an ontology of powers (potencies). While the former objected to the introduction of a contingent kind of necessitation, the latter felt it did not go far enough -- that the necessitation in laws should be metaphysical. Armstrong's N seems to sit uncomfortably between contingency and necessity. That said, Mumford remarks on Armstrong's very interesting argument in favour of his view over the regularity view in connection with Hume's problem of induction. Armstrong sometimes seems to suggest that the regularity theory is the source of the problem of induction and that correspondingly nomic necessitation solves that problem, and this is also the impression that Mumford gives. Yet this seems implausible, since the kicker in Hume's argument is the circularity of justifying induction by induction, and that aspect is not addressed at all in the regularity-necessitation debate. That problem, for many epistemologists, is resolved by appealing to some kind of externalist epistemology, such as Armstrong's own reliabilism. It seems to me that what is going on is something different. It is not that the regularity theory invites the problem of induction, but nomic necessitation does not. Rather, they both do, but the regularity theory means that nothing will solve the problem of induction, not even some fancy epistemology. Imagine a genuinely accidental regularity whose instances include items in the future. That, we may think, cannot be known for Armstrong's reasons -- there is nothing tying the instances together. That's true even with a non-Humean reliabilist epistemology. Armstrong's complaint against the regularity theory is that the same would hold for laws if they too were regularities. The law versus accidental regularity distinction has no significant metaphysical content for the regularity theorist (the difference is not intrinsic); the difference between a law and an accident, i.e. deducibility from an optimal system, is not enough to tie the instances of the law together. Thus it is not that the nomic necessitarian solves the problem of induction while the regularity theorist does not. Rather it is that it is impossible for the regularity theorist to solve it whereas it is at least possible that the necessitarian can. Another interesting corollary of Armstrong's view of the epistemology of laws (which is inference to the best explanation) is that we are better justified in inferring <it is a law that all Fs are Gs> than in inferring <all Fs are Gs> with no commitment to whether there is a law that all Fs are Gs. This seems to conflict with the thought that one is always more justified in believing the logically weaker of two propositions when one entails the other. Yet the idea that one can know a regularity to be true only if one knows the corresponding law to be true is an important and attractive one that deserves renewed attention.

After the first chapter on naturalism, setting out Armstrong's fundamental philosophical commitments, Mumford's book continues with chapters on the metaphysical issues for which Armstrong is currently best known -- universals, laws of nature, dispositions, and states of affairs. Mumford then returns to an earlier period in Armstrong's career, when he was concerned principally with issues in the philosophy of mind and perception (chapters on sensation and perception, the metaphysics of mind, and knowledge and belief). It may be news to more than a few that Armstrong started as a Berkeley scholar. Yet this interest exemplifies one of Mumford's themes: that Armstrong's metaphysical work originates in thinking that was a natural response to questions in the philosophy of perception. Berkeley himself shows how metaphysical and perceptual questions may be related. Armstrong was particularly interested in the sense of touch. One point that Mumford notes in particular is Armstrong's claim that the perception of pressure is the direct perception of causal power. This is a claim that will be put to use later in explaining how we can have knowledge of nomic necessitation (which Armstrong takes to be the same second order relation as causation). Mumford shows how Armstrong eschewed Berkeleyan phenomenalism and Lockean indirect realism, and opted for direct realism. But in order to defend that position, Armstrong had to respond to the argument from illusion. This is where Armstrong introduces his account of perceptual experience in terms of belief. Hallucinations and at least some other illusions are to be understood on the model of false belief. However, one might know full well that a certain experience is non-veridical (e.g. one knows from past occurrences that one's hallucinations of a pink elephant are the effect of the need for a drink and not the effect of the presence of a brightly-coloured pachyderm). In such cases the subject has the hallucination as if p but does not believe p. Armstrong's response is that the hallucination is not the belief itself but rather a disposition to believe. This is one of the sources of Armstrong's later metaphysical interest in dispositions.

Dispositions, and the distinction between a disposition and its manifestations, are also central to Armstrong's A Materialist Theory of Mind. Behaviourism seeks to analyse mental phenomena in terms of behaviour alone. Armstrong regards this as denying any room for anything like an inner mental life, whereas this is permitted by the dispositional view of mental states. On the other hand naturalism calls for a rejection of dualism and the adoption of some kind of materialist approach. Armstrong's view is a type-type identity account, although this faces now familiar problems, the first being the problem of multiple realizability and the second being the fact that Armstrong thinks that the identity theory is contingently true (dualism is possible, but actually false). Mumford rightly puts pressure on the second point in particular. Armstrong's response that the physical state description is not a rigid designator is problematic. Nonetheless, his willingness to contemplate the token-token identity view does provide an answer to the first, multiple realizability problem. (And arguably it provides an answer to the second problem also, although such views now face the causal over-determination problems identified by Kim.) Mumford goes on to explain how the naturalistically crucial explanation of intentionality requires a subtle holistic account of perception and intentionality. These are issues addressed further in Belief, Truth, and Knowledge. Mumford gives a sympathetic account of this very important book, notable for its early articulation of epistemological reliabilism; he then uses the cue of truth to return to metaphysical issues, now focussing on recent developments in Armstrong's thought, especially those that concern truthmaking and necessity (which form the topics of Mumford's final two chapters).

Mumford reminds us that the truthmaking idea is present in Armstrong's work from early on -- the rejection of Ryle's phenomenalism about dispositions is an application of the idea that a true claim about the dispositions of a person or thing requires some fact or other to be the truthmaker for that claim. Every disposition needs a categorical basis, so that the object's possessing this categorical basis is the truthmaker for the dispositional claim; in the case of a mental disposition it is some brain state that furnishes the truthmaker. Mumford presents Armstrong's last book Truth and Truthmakers as the capstone of his metaphysical work (Mumford tells us that Armstrong does not plan any further books). We are given helpful sketches of Armstrong's responses to various problems for truthmaking -- negative and general truths, necessary truth, and so forth. The latter allows Armstrong to round off his naturalistic project with an account of mathematical truth.

It would be natural to end this book with the chapter on truthmaking. Yet Armstrong has continued to think about many of the same problems, willing to look at new angles on them, and engaging generously with the work of younger philosophers inspired by his work but sometimes critical of it (Mumford himself being a prime example). In Truth and Truthmakers Armstrong returns to the problem of instantiation in response to work by Donald Baxter, and proposes an understanding of instantiation as partial identity. Mumford concludes his book by exploring the consequences of this view for Armstrong's system, consequences that are radical indeed, involving a rethinking, for example, of the commitment to contingentism and Hume's dictum that there is no necessitation between distinct existences.

Mumford's book gives not only a sympathetic introduction to Armstrong's thought, but also affords a very useful overview of that thought and its systematic connections. At the same time it conveys the verve of Armstrong's philosophy, and will be a very welcome companion to Armstrong's thought for anyone interested in metaphysics, from student to professional.