David Hume: Essays, Moral, Political, and Literary


David Hume, David Hume: Essays, Moral, Political, and Literary, 2 Vols., Tom L. Beauchamp and Mark A. Box (eds.), Clarendon Press, 2021, 1200pp., $230.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198847090.   

Reviewed by Paul Russell, Lund University


Looking across the distance of time to admire David Hume’s contributions and achievements, we are presented not with a single peak but with a range of towering peaks. From the perspective of contemporary philosophy, it is Hume’s first and lengthiest work, A Treatise of Human Nature, published in 1739–40, that dominates the horizon. There are, nevertheless, other peaks standing nearby. This includes both the Enquiries, on human understanding (1748) and on morals (1751) respectively, in which Hume “recasts” his Treatise. It also includes Hume’s posthumously published Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion (1779). Although these works are generally regarded as containing the core of Hume’s philosophy, they are by no means his only great works. There is also Hume’s History of England, published in six volumes between 1754 and 1762—a work that did much to advance Hume’s reputation among his own contemporaries. To this we might add Hume’s Dissertation on the Passions and his Natural History of Religion, which were first published along with two other essays in 1757. With all these works in view it is easy to understand why many readers may overlook or neglect another set of works that stand beside them, namely Hume’s various Essays, which were published between 1741 and 1777. No account of Hume’s achievements is complete without a proper appreciation of his Essays.

In his autobiographical essay “My Own Life” Hume, famously, confesses that “love of literary fame” was his “ruling passion”. Some commentators—most notably John Herman Randall—have used these remarks to suggest that Hume, for all his considerable philosophical ability, was motivated by nothing better than fame and money (1962, 631). The striking change of style and content found in Hume’s Essays, which clearly aim at a wider and more popular audience, could be construed in these unflattering terms but few would now accept this account. There is, nevertheless, no denying that the disappointing reception of the Treatise encouraged Hume to radically rethink and revise his writings and the audience that he aimed to reach. From the beginning, Hume was well aware of the “common prejudice” against “metaphysics” and “abstruse philosophy” (T, Intro 3). At the beginning of Book III of the Treatise, which was published in late 1740, Hume admits that the “abstruse philosophy” contained in the Treatise is unlikely to be well received “in an age, wherein the greatest part of men seem agreed to convert reading into an amusement, and to reject every thing that requires any considerable degree of attention to be comprehended” (T, 3.1.1). Shortly after these remarks went into print, Hume published the first edition of his Essays.

In “Of Essay Writing”—an early essay that was withdrawn after publication in 1742—Hume laments that learning has been “shut up in the Colleges and Cells, and secluded from the World and Good Company” (ESY, I, 3). It was Hume’s aim to bridge this gap between “the learned and conversible World”—something that his Treatise had clearly failed to do. In the opening remarks to his first Enquiry Hume returns to this theme concerning the schism between the “learned world” and “common life”. There are, he notes, “two different species of philosophy”, the “easy and obvious” and “the abstruse” (EU; 1. 2–3). The Treatise, evidently, falls heavily on the side of “the abstruse” and “abstract” philosophy, hence its lack of influence and success. In contrast with this, the easy philosophy is engaged with common life and has some prospect of being able to influence both our sentiments and our conduct. It does not follow from this, however, that we should altogether abandon the abstruse philosophy. On the contrary, the abstruse philosophy ensures that all our reasonings concerning human life are sufficiently exact and precise. What is required, therefore, is some middle ground or balance to be struck between these two different species of philosophy (EU, 1. 5–12). If the vulnerability of abstruse philosophy is that it is rendered dull and irrelevant, the vulnerability of the easy philosophy is that it becomes “shallow” and has nothing new to say to us. “An author”, Hume notes elsewhere, “is little to be valued, who tells us nothing but what we can learn from every coffee-house conversation” (ESY, 1, 199).

Finding the right balance between these two species of philosophy is something Hume aims at in his Essays, a number of which were directed primarily at readers of Addison, Steele, and Swift, rather than those of Descartes, Locke and Clarke. Hume was not always able to strike that balance to his own satisfaction. This no doubt explains why he subsequently withdrew a number of his earlier essays on the grounds that they were too “frivolous” and “trivial” (LET, I, 112; I, 168). Perhaps the best known of the early essays that Hume retained is a set of four essays devoted to describing the philosophical characters of four sects of philosophy: the Epicurean, Stoic, Platonic, and Sceptic. These essays show how each of these philosophical characters aim to achieve happiness. Whatever the relative merits of these essays may be, the adjustments that Hume made proved immediately successful and his Essays were “favourably received”. This change in his fortune continued with the publication of the Political Discourses in 1752, which Hume describes as “the only work of [his] that was successful on the first publication” and as being “well received abroad and at home” (1985, xxxvi). The major focus of attention in the Political Discourses is economics, which occupies more than half of the dozen essays contained. Other important essays in this volume include “Of the Populousness of Ancient Nations” and “Idea of a Perfect Commonwealth”, which is indicative of the wide range of Hume’s interests and concerns, and which suggest links with several of his earlier essays relating to politics, history, and other topics of that kind.

With regard to the contemporary value and interest of Hume’s Essays, views about this will vary, depending on the reader and their own individual concerns. In his Advertisement to the 1741 edition of the Essays, Hume advises his readers “not [to] look for any Connexion among these Essays, but [to] consider each of them as a Work apart” (ESY, I, 529). For this reason many readers will come to Hume’s essays with a view to selecting particular essays and ignoring others. Some may focus on his studies relating to economics and commerce, others will focus on the essays concerned with politics and history, and so on. Nor is there any reason to suppose that all the essays are of (equal) value or worth, as plainly Hume’s own assessment and attitude suggests that is not the case. Nevertheless, in the final analysis it is clear that, however uneven these essays may be in quality, there is a range and substance to the whole that justifies our continued interest in this collection, irrespective of their relevance to Hume’s other works and contributions.

Perhaps the most obvious source of contemporary interest in Hume’s Essays is that, both individually and collectively, they shed a great deal of light on Hume’s other works, including the Treatise, the Enquiries, and the Dialogues. Any serious student of Hume’s views on morality, for example, will want to examine his views in “Of the Standard of Taste”. Those who are interested in Hume’s writings relating to religion will need to consider his essay “Of Superstition and Enthusiasm”. Similarly, Hume’s essays on liberty, the original contract, and the idea of a perfect commonwealth are obviously of direct relevance to his views about justice and politics as presented in the Treatise and the Enquiries. It may be argued, in light of this, that despite their stylistic differences and manner of presentation, there are important themes and concerns that not only hold the various essays together but also connect them with the whole corpus of Hume’s writings.

The range and plurality of Hume’s interests and investigations is not evidence of a disjointed and fragmented mind or intellect. On the contrary, the methods and approach that Hume applies to the various topics and subjects he takes up display his commitment to a core philosophical outlook. That outlook has itself several dimensions, including a commitment to a naturalistic understanding of human nature and the various forms of historical and cultural life that it gives rise to. It also reflects a modest optimism about our ability to make sense of our own existence and to free ourselves from forms of illusion, ignorance, and oppression that can only make us miserable. Most importantly, Hume’s Essays manifest a particular form of Enlightenment confidence that we can come to understand ourselves, and improve our condition, without relying on the falsehoods and fantasies of superstition. Each essay, however focused it may be, reflects this underlying philosophical attitude and aspiration, which runs throughout all of Hume’s writings.

The history of Hume’s Essays, and how they evolved and expanded over a period of several decades, is clearly a complex matter. Hume produced nearly fifty essays that were published in eleven editions between 1741 and 1777 (the exact number may vary, depending on what is included or counted). Throughout this process some essays were added, and others deleted. This whole process culminated in the final 1777 edition of Essays, Moral, Political and Literary (Volume I of Essays and Treatises on Several Subjects), which Hume carefully edited and corrected before he died in 1776. For that edition, eight earlier essays were withdrawn and twenty were added to the original twenty-seven that were published in two volumes in 1741–2. This left the 1777 edition with a total of thirty-nine essays. Two of the Four Dissertations that Hume published in 1757 were included (“Of Tragedy” and “Of the Standard of Taste”), and two were not included (“The Natural History of Religion” and “On the Passions”).[1] Also not included were two essays printed in 1755, in a collection titled Five Dissertations, but were then “suppressed”.[2] These are Hume’s posthumously published essays “Of Suicide” and “Of the Immortality of the Soul”, which were published together under the title Two Essays in London in 1777 without the author’s name or that of the publisher on the title-page. All this makes it clear enough that the editors of any contemporary edition of Hume’s Essays are presented with a large and difficult task when deciding how to select, arrange, and present this material.

The new two volume edition of Hume’s Essays, Moral, Political and Literary, edited by Tom Beauchamp and Mark Box, is the first critical edition.[3] What primarily distinguishes a critical edition is that it collates the copy-text with all other editions and provides a complete record of variations in the texts. Beauchamp and Box provide readers with detailed, informative notes and annotations that describe the variations and revisions that have been made to the Essays published within Hume’s lifetime. They also provide a table that catalogues the contents of the various editions from 1741 to 1771 and several helpful appendixes relating to their publication. The final text of the essays has been carefully edited and annotated. The second volume contains the editors’ extensive annotations, which are both informed and illuminating. All the editorial work has been done with enormous attention to detail and precision.

Beauchamp and Box’s critical edition of Hume’s Essays is the most recent addition to “The Clarendon Edition of the Works of David Hume”. Prior to this edition, Beauchamp has also edited three other works by Hume for the Clarendon Edition: An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (2000); An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (1998); and A Dissertation on the Passions and The Natural History of Religion (2007). All of these works have been edited and annotated to the same very high standard. Taken together, this is a significant and substantial contribution to Hume scholarship. The only major (philosophical) works by Hume that are not included in the Clarendon Edition, at this time, are Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion and his two “suppressed” essays, on suicide and immortality. Hopefully this gap will be filled in the not too distant future and, when published, will live up to the high standard that Beauchamp and Box have set with the critical edition of Hume’s Essays.


David Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, edited by D.F. Norton and M. Norton. 2 Vols. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007). Abbreviated as T. This edition includes Hume’s Abstract of a Treatise of Human Nature and his A Letter from a Gentleman to his friend in Edinburgh (1745).

David Hume, An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, edited by T. Beauchamp (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000). Abbreviated as EU.

David Hume, An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, edited by T. Beauchamp (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998).

David Hume, A Dissertation on the Passions / The Natural History of Religion, edited by T. Beauchamp (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007).

David Hume, Essays, Moral, Political, and Literary, edited by T. Beauchamp and M. Box, 2 Vols. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2021). Abbreviated as ESY.

David Hume, Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion and Other Writings, edited by D. Coleman (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).

David Hume, My Own Life; first published in 1777, reprinted in David Hume, Essays, Moral, Political and Literary, rev. ed., Eugene F. Miller ed. (Indianapolis: Liberty Classics, 1985), xxxi–xli.

David Hume, Letters of David Hume, edited by J.Y.T. Greig, 2 Vols. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1932). Abbreviated as LET.

Ernest Mossner, The Life of David Hume, 2nd ed. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980).

John H. Randall, The Career of Philosophy; Vol. 1, From the Middle Ages to the Enlightenment (New York and London: Columbia University Press, 1962).


[1] “The Natural History of Religion” and “On the Passions” were published in Vol. II of Essays and Treatises on Several Subjects (Edinburgh, 1777), along with Hume’s two Enquiries.

[2] Details about this are provided in Mossner (1980), Chap. 24.

[3] Prior to the publication of the critical edition of Hume’s Essays the most complete and comprehensive edition was Eugene Miller’s 1985 edition (Indianapolis: Liberty Classics). Miller’s edition includes Hume’s “suppressed” essays on suicide and immortality, which are not included in Beauchamp and Box’s critical edition. Miller’s edition also includes Hume’s “My Own Life”, which is also omitted by Beauchamp and Box (and is not included in any other volume of the Clarendon Edition of Hume’s Works). Miller’s edition remains a useful and reliable edition for the general reader.