Deleuze and Ancient Greek Physics: The Image of Nature

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Michael James Bennett, Deleuze and Ancient Greek Physics: The Image of Nature, Bloomsbury, 2017, 288pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474284677.

Reviewed by Brent Adkins, Roanoke College


The scholarship that examines Deleuze's use of and relation to Hellenic philosophy is rich and growing. Recent works include Sean Bowden's The Priority of Events and Ryan Johnson's The Deleuze-Lucretius Encounter. Michael James Bennett's book is a new and important contribution to this conversation. Not only does it give new insight into Deleuze's sources and arguments, but, in the spirit of Deleuze's history of philosophy, Bennett also allows us to see what the Stoics and Epicureans (and Deleuze with them) are creating in their thought.

Chief among these creations, according to Bennett, is a new "image of nature." "Image of nature" is deployed here with technical specificity, meant to invoke Deleuze's use of the phrase "image of thought" in Difference and Repetition. Although, Deleuze is largely critical of the image of thought, Bennett qualifies it with the term "dogmatic." This allows him to argue for a non-dogmatic image of thought and its concomitant (and presumably non-dogmatic) image of nature. What precisely, though, would distinguish between a dogmatic and non-dogmatic "image," whether of thought or nature? For Deleuze, as Bennett shows, the difference can be articulated grammatically (hypotaxis vs. parataxis), logically (attribution vs. conjunction), or metaphysically (ontology vs. pragmatics). Fortunately, all of these oppositions can be summarized in the straightforward distinction between "is" and "and." The dogmatic image of thought seeks to restrict thought's exposure to difference by organizing its relation to the unthought in terms of hierarchy (hypotaxis), the copula of attribution, or the verb "to be." Bennett clearly shows that Deleuze draws on Hellenic philosophy precisely so that he can propose an alternative, non-dogmatic image of thought: one that is paratactical, conjunctive, and pragmatic. In short, one that replaces "is" with "and."

Bennett's argument for replacing "is" with "and" begins with Deleuze's project of "overturning Platonism" and his reading of Plato's Sophist. The key issue in the Sophist from Deleuze's perspective is "non-being that, in a sense, is." "Non-being that, in a sense, is" is where Deleuze locates problematic notions in the history of philosophy such as becoming and difference. On Bennett's reading, Deleuze's engagement with Hellenic philosophy is an attempt to follow this line of inquiry from the Sophist in a way that overturns philosophy's traditional self-interpretation. In order to explicate this minority engagement with the philosophical tradition, Bennett casts Deleuze in the role of commentator, specifically a commentator of the type that populates the ancient and medieval philosophical landscapes.

From Deleuze's perspective, though, commentary should not merely reproduce what one is commenting on. Rather, in commentary, the philosopher must do two things simultaneously: pursue maximal modification while showing that these modifications are authorized by the text. Topology provides a helpful illustration of this type of commentary. A torus is a doughnut shaped object. Topologically speaking, the torus remains a torus (i.e., the same shape) as long as it maintains a single hole. Any new holes or tears would create a different shape. Thus, a doughnut shape may be modified into the shape of a coffee cup. Here the single hole becomes the thin handle while the remaining volume is stretched and made concave, the cup. Both the doughnut and the coffee cup are modifications of the same shape. In the same way, Deleuze's readings of Hellenic philosophy are rooted in the text while being maximal modifications of the text. The purpose of such modification is to intensify the overturning of Platonism already present in the text.

After his discussion of Plato's Sophist, Bennett turns to the Stoics. Over the course of three chapters, he proposes to:

explain and evaluate Deleuze's appropriation of Stoic metaphysics in light of three of his key claims: (1) that the Stoic ontologico-semantic theory of incorporeal lekta is an account of the sense (sens, Sinn) of propositions, (2) that the occurrence of events is associated with the allegedly Stoic notion of a 'metaphysical surface' and involves a shift from formal to 'transcendental logic,' and (3) that Stoic fatalism and astrology express a rigorous theory of the relations among events (33).

Bennett shifts seamlessly among Stoic metaphysics, analytic philosophy of language, and Logic of Sense to make a compelling case that not only is  Deleuze a subtle reader of the Stoics, but that he also effects a maximal modification of the Stoics by pushing as far as he can the distinction between corporeal bodies that are determined by necessity and incorporeal lekta that are aleatory events.

In order to set up his discussion of Epicureanism, Bennett works through the Aristotelian conceptions of analogy and individuation. Much is at stake in both of these chapters, since Deleuze's metaphysics is so clearly defined by his opposition to the analogy of being and hylomorphism. In both chapters, Bennett shows himself to be an astute reader of both Aristotle and Deleuze. He carefully distinguishes between analogy and homonymy on the one hand and specific difference (diaphora) and inter-generic difference (heterotēs) on the other hand. The problem remains, however, that being is not a genus for Aristotle, so what is to be done with the different senses of being? Are they mere homonyms like the different senses of "bank"? Or, are they what Bennett (following Christopher Shields) calls "core-dependent" homonyms like "life," where all of the senses seem to tend toward a unity (pros hen)? Aristotle opts for the latter, and Deleuze's claim (on Bennett's reading) is that the different senses of being are in fact treated on the model of inter-generic difference, and thus unified by analogy. The difficulty with this from Deleuze's perspective is that it tames difference. Difference on this model is always subordinated to some kind of unity. Difference in itself is never expressed.

This same difficulty persists in Aristotle's account of hylomorphism, which from Deleuze's perspective simply reproduces analogical judgment in physics and biology. As Bennett argues, such a system of judgment makes it difficult for Aristotle to account for individuation. In order to articulate a genetic account of individuation, Deleuze (following Simondon) seizes on the notion of intensity as providing a non-hylomorphic account of individuation. Intensive processes sometimes achieve metastable states, as in an oscillating reaction or the genetic stability of large populations commonly referred to as "species." Notice that on this model notions such as genus and species do not pre-exist the individual, but are themselves the result of the process of individuation. Furthermore, these categories are not "given" or "natural," but subject to becoming. This shift away from hylomorphism allows Deleuze to redefine the individual as a set of capacities exercised to a certain degree of intensity. Or, in Stoic terms, the individual is an event.

For Bennett, the key ideas that Deleuze draws from Epicureanism are "the distinction between physically indivisible atoms and conceptually indivisible minima or 'minimal parts,' and the famous atomic 'swerve'" (165). The distinction between atoms and minima allows Deleuze to explore the possibility of a new geometry, a problematic, Archimedean geometry in opposition to the dominant axiomatic, Euclidean geometry. Bennett does a remarkable job of unpacking a very dense passage from Difference and Repetition in order to show how dependent it is on ideas drawn from Epicureanism. Bennett then connects these ideas to Deleuze's use of calculus, particularly in post-Kantian philosophy, which he explicates in the second chapter on Epicureanism. The outcome of this reading is that Epicurean physics, particularly the "swerve," is seen as "problematic" in precisely the way lauded by Deleuze and Guattari in A Thousand Plateaus. That is, Epicurean physics poses a problem in a way that drives thought and spurs it to create new concepts.

In the final main chapter, Bennett seeks a rapprochement of sorts between Stoicism and Epicureanism, at least insofar as the traditions inform Deleuze's thought. He reinscribes well-known Deleuzian concepts such as chaos, speed, and the virtual within the context of Hellenic philosophy. This is particularly helpful as it provides another angle from which to approach these ideas apart from the typical Bergsonian accounts.

My only quibbles with what is an outstanding book lie in Bennett's treatment of the images of thought and nature. As I noted above, he argues that Deleuze wants to propose a new image of thought, a non-dogmatic one. However, in Difference and Repetition, at least, Deleuze argues that philosophy can only properly begin by renouncing the image of thought and that philosophy "would discover its authentic repetition in a thought without Image" (DR 132). Later, making a similar point, Deleuze writes, "It is not a question of opposing to the dogmatic image of thought another image" (DR 148). Bennett acknowledges texts such as these early on, but persists in referring to Deleuze's "new image of thought." Admittedly, this is complicated by A Thousand Plateaus' proposal of "noology" as the study of different images of thought. Also, depending on how one conceives of the plane of immanence in What is Philosophy? in relation to image of thought, one may need to rethink whether a thought without image is possible. These same concerns apply also to the image of nature, but my real wish was simply to see it developed further. My hope is that Bennett will pursue this line of thinking in future works.

In conclusion, this is an excellent book with much to recommend it to not only Deleuze scholars, but also to scholars of ancient Greek and Hellenic philosophy.