Aristotle, De Anima

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C.D.C. Reeve (tr., ed.), Aristotle, De Anima, Hackett, 2017, 227 pp., $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781624666193.

Reviewed by Caleb Cohoe, Metropolitan State University of Denver


This is an excellent translation of Aristotle's De Anima or On the Soul, part of C.D.C. Reeve's impressive ongoing project of translating Aristotle's works for the New Hackett Aristotle. Reeve's translation is careful and accurate, committed to faithfully rendering Aristotle into English while making him as readable as possible. This edition features excellent notes that will greatly assist readers (especially in their inclusion of related passages that illuminate the sections they annotate) and an introduction that situates the work within Aristotle's scientific method and his overall view of reality.

Reeve's introduction discusses the status of Aristotle's science of the soul. His treatment is not merely an overview of this topic but a significant and welcome contribution to current scholarship on the scientific status of Aristotle's psychology. Reeve says, correctly, that Aristotle's "science of soul" has "its feet in botany and its head in theology." (xxviii) It includes the principle by which plants live, but it also covers the understanding (ho nous), which can know all things, including Aristotle's divine being. Reeve, unlike many contemporary Aristotle scholars, acknowledges that Aristotle is, in fact, committed to the view that the understanding is a power that is not the form of any part of the body, but instead has its own activity, one that is separable from the human body.

What kind of science, then, can psychology be for Aristotle? The DA, like Aristotle's biological works, generally lacks the kind of demonstrative structure Aristotle demands of science in his Posterior Analytics (APo). It does not prominently feature syllogistic proofs. Reeve explains this by taking the DA to be a work of dialectic. For Reeve, its goal is to "correctly show the explanatory starting-points of the science of psychology (natural and theological)" and to do so by "going through puzzles and solving these by appeal to reputable beliefs." (xxxvi) Dialectic, in this sense, proceeds by refining our raw starting-points, drawing on the catalogue of facts produced by the scientist and the reputable beliefs assembled by the honest dialectician. (p. xlii) Aristotle begins this process in book I, with an examination of the views of his predecessors on living activities. He then refines his own views and clarifies the starting points in books II-III. Even when Aristotle employs arguments that resemble demonstrations, Reeve thinks that he is still proceeding dialectically, since we get to the correct starting points "in part by seeing whether or to what extent we could demonstrate from them." (xli) For Reeve, then, Aristotle's project in the DA is to make the case for the soul as a starting point, as the principle that explains the various characteristics of living things -- their nutritive activities, movement, perception, and understanding. This prepares the ground for scientific demonstrations in the APo sense. Reeve's discussion of dialectic and the DA is convincing and thorough, with evidence from across the corpus. It offers one of the most careful interpretations of the status of the DA available in the contemporary literature.

Reeve also provides an illuminating discussion of the way in which humans are our understanding "most of all (malista)" (Nicomachean Ethics (NE) IX 8116ab32). He maintains that human beings are to be identified with our understanding insofar as the understanding is the "'true self' -- the source of those actions that are most our own." (p. xxxii) The understanding is the element that should be in control, and it is responsible for the actions that we see most of all as voluntary -- those that issue from our reason.

There is, however, one serious drawback to Reeve's introduction: the very large role it gives to pneuma, breath or vital heat. Reeve thinks pneuma "brings life and soul into the right sort of body." (p. xxiii) But pneuma does not appear in this role in the DA. First of all, many scholars (including myself) do not think pneuma is central to Aristotle's account of living things in the way that Reeve suggests. Even if it is, there is a methodological issue about its significance within the DA. Pneuma is admittedly important to Aristotle's theory of animal locomotion, since it can produce various motions by expanding and contracting, as Reeve points out (xxi-xxii). The relevance of this to the DA's focus on the soul as a formal principle and starting point of life is, however, dubious. In the opening lines of his On Sense (De Sensu), Aristotle states that he has already (presumably in the DA) treated of the soul "in itself (kath' hautên)" and is now turning to a consideration of things common to soul and body. Aristotle's main discussions of pneuma occur in his biological works, treatises that are more focused on the body and on material factors relevant to life. Even if pneuma plays an important role in Aristotle's account of certain biological activities, it does not play a significant role in Aristotle's theory of the soul as such, the subject of the DA. Aristotle's procedure bears this out. Out of the 677 occurrences of pneuma and cognates in the TLG version of Aristotle's corpus, only 3 of them are in the DA. All three references seem to be to breath in its ordinary sense, not a technical usage.

Now Reeve does make some interpretive moves that would expand its role. In his introduction, he takes pneuma to be the common factor that makes a variety of media (air, water etc.) transparent (p. xxii), which would make it important for a variety of phenomena Aristotle discusses in connection with perception (in DA II 7 and elsewhere). But Reeve provides little textual evidence for thinking that the "certain nature" (418b8) that makes things transparent should be identified with pneuma. Reeve then connects pneuma to aithêr, Aristotle's indestructible heavenly element, a move which, again, seems too quick. Aithêr's transparency does little to establish it as the same as or analogous to pneuma. Reeve then posits a role for aithêr in his rather idiosyncratic theory of the understanding: intellect is passed on in human generation via "movements in ether that code for it." (p. xxvi). The idea that understanding consists in or is "coded by" the unceasing "circular movements" (ibid.) of ether is implausible. There is no trace of this in Aristotle's own discussion of understanding in DA III 4-8, and Reeve's theory seems subject to many of the criticisms which Aristotle raises in DA I 3 against theories that connect understanding with movement. On Reeve's view, pneuma is a special sort of stuff whose qualities make things alive: "the vitalizing factor," (p. xxiii) as he calls it. On this interpretation, Aristotle is not too far away from the Stoic materialist theory of soul, where pneuma, of course, plays the central role. This theory seems to make pneuma the real formal and efficient cause of life, since it produces life and soul in the body. It undermines the idea that the soul, a formal principle, is what primarily explains life. Reeve's interpretation of pneuma is certainly worthy of scholarly debate, but readers should be aware that the introduction is, on this point, not transmitting a broad consensus, but advancing a novel and controversial interpretation.

The copious notes supplied by Reeve are consistently helpful. Perhaps their most impressive feature is the extensive references provided. Instead of just giving citation information, Reeve typically quotes the passages from other authors which Aristotle is referencing or supplies the reader with key texts from elsewhere in Aristotle's corpus that clarify his thought. This is particularly useful in book I, when Aristotle is discussing the views of his predecessors. Instead of having to hunt up Heraclitus and Democritus or leaf through the relevant dialogues of Plato, the reader can go over the relevant passages in the notes and compare them to Aristotle's interpretation. This is a great service. Reeve's mastery of the Aristotelian corpus is apparent in the notes, as he includes references and connections that are illuminating but not obvious. For example, in discussing Aristotle on the power of perception as a mean that is "capable of discerning (kritikon)," Reeve quotes Aristotle's discussion of the judge as a mediator in NE V 4, to spell out the way in which the mean is able to discern and appreciate both sides (note 282, p. 138). The notes are helpfully cross-referenced to one another, though it would be nice to have these cross-references indexed to the numbering of the notes themselves, not just the Bekker numbers of their corresponding passages.

The translation manifests Reeve's extensive experience with Aristotle and his philosophical vocabulary. He has carefully thought through the best English renderings of all the key terms and provides cogent reasons for his choices in his notes. For example, he renders phronêsis as "wisdom," making the case that, in the DA, Aristotle is using this word in its broader sense, common in Plato, not in the specific sense of "practical wisdom" (the term Reeve correctly uses to translate phronêsis in the NE) (note 38, p. 84). Reeve's position is convincing, especially since sophia, the word Aristotle uses in the NE to contrast theoretical wisdom with phronêsis in the sense of practical wisdom, does not appear in the DA. Reeve also carefully distinguishes entelecheia, an "actuality" or "actualization" (of something) from energeia, an "activity" or "activation" (of something) (note 7, p. 72-73). While some translators treat these words as equivalent, it is important for readers to be able to track Aristotle's usage. Reeve's terminology is also consistent across his translations, an advantage for readers using his New Aristotle series either as part of a course on Aristotle or for their own reading. "Scientific knowledge" for epistêmê and "understanding" for nous match his renderings of the Metaphysics, NE, etc. (with exceptions, of course, where Reeve thinks Aristotle uses the word in different ways in different works, as in the case of phronêsis).

Reeve does not simply follow previous translators. On his translation, Aristotle characterizes the soul in DA II 1 as "the first actualization of a natural instrumental [organikon] body" (412b5-6). Most translators have translated organikon as "organic," merely transliterating, in effect. Given that Aristotle will go on to claim that natural bodies are "instruments of the soul" (II 4, 415b18), it is good to make it clear to readers from the beginning that the body of a living thing is organikon in the sense of being a tool. "Organic" also has misleading connotations these days, given its evocations in discussions of health food.

There is an unfortunate error in the first sentence of the translation. As printed, it reads:

Supposing that knowing to be a noble and an estimable thing, and one sort more so than another either in virtue of its exactness or by being about better and more wondrous things.

According to Reeve, he was considering two different translations and a mix-up between them occurred in the process. The two versions are:

1. We suppose knowing to be a noble and an estimable thing, and one sort more so than another either in virtue of its exactness or by being about better and more wondrous things.

2. Supposing that knowing to be a noble and an estimable thing, and one sort more so than another either in virtue of its exactness or by being about better and more wondrous things, on both these grounds we may quite reasonably place the study of soul in the first rank.

Reeve now prefers option 1, so readers can amend his text accordingly. The only other error I noticed in the translation itself was p. 59, 432b28, where "that" needs to be replaced with "than."

So, how does Reeve's rendering of the DA compare to the recent translation offered by Christopher Shields (2016)? Both Reeve and Shields are sensitive translators who carefully track the structure of Aristotle's reasoning. In general, both do a good job of rendering Aristotle's Greek into English as accurately as possible. To see them in action, let us consider the following passage from the end of DA II 1, 413a2-8:

Just as the eye-jelly and sight are an eye, so in this case the soul and the body are an animal. Hence that the soul is not separable from the body -- or that certain parts of it are not, if it naturally has parts -- is quite clear. For of some parts the actuality is of the parts themselves. Nevertheless nothing prevents some of them at any rate from being separable, because of being the actualities of no body. Further, it is unclear whether the soul is the actualization of the body in this way or in the way that a sailor is of a ship. (Trans. Reeve)

Just as an eye is a pupil and sight, so in this case too an animal is the soul and the body. Therefore, that the soul is not separable from the body, or some parts of it if it naturally has parts, is not unclear. For the actuality of some parts belongs to the parts themselves. Even so, nothing hinders some parts from being separable, because of their not being the actualities of a body. It is still unclear, however, whether the soul is the actuality of the body in the way that a sailor is of a ship. (Trans. Shields)

Both translations stay very close to Aristotle's phrasing and syntax, awkward as it sometimes is, while also illustrating some key interpretive choices. Reeve chooses "eye-jelly" for korê instead of Shields' more conventional rendering of "pupil." Shields is opting for the usual Ancient Greek meaning of the word when applied to the eye, while Reeve's choice relies on the specific way in which Aristotle will later characterize the korê as the watery and transparent organ of sight. Reeve's rendering gets across the idea that the korê is the matter. In Aristotle's analogy, the eye-jelly is a kind of stuff that needs to be configured.

Throughout the passage, we see both translators working to figure out the best way to render Aristotle's combinations of conditionals, negations, and negative prefixes into English. In the second sentence, Shields's rendition is more strictly literal, stating that the soul's inseparability is "not unclear." Reeve renders the thought in a more natural English idiom: the soul's inseparability is "quite clear." The latter seems preferable, to avoid being excessively literal and for the sake of clarity. In the penultimate sentence, the translators switch strategies, with Reeve opting for the more strictly literal rendering: some parts of the soul are "the actualities of no body." In Shields, these parts might be separable because of "not being the actualities of a body." Again, I prefer the translation that puts the negation where it more naturally fits in English: Shields, in this case. These examples illustrate the challenges in finding the right balance so as to render Aristotle directly, without excessive interpretation, while also taking into account the ways in which his syntax and expressions need to be adjusted to English. Both translators are doing a good job of trying to get the reader as close as possible to Aristotle's frequently convoluted Greek.

In the last sentence, Reeve describes the soul as "the actualization of the body." This is due to his general strategy of switching from "actuality," his general rendering of entelecheia, to "actualization" in cases where Aristotle tells us the item of which something is the entelecheia. Saying that x is the actualization of y gets across the directed relationship of y towards x and is somewhat clearer than saying x is the actuality of y, a phrase that is not perspicuous in English, especially for those who have not been initiated into Aristotelian jargon. However, these two slightly different renderings of the same concept may be misleading, especially for readers who are not fully aware of Reeve's policy. In this passage, the last two sentences are both talking about the soul as the entelecheia of the body, but Reeve switches from "actuality" to "actualization," potentially suggesting a difference where there is none.

The last sentence in this passage comes out rather differently because Reeve follows Ross in emending the received text, adding an ê to give us two alternatives. This distinguishes Aristotle's own position from the view that the soul is like a sailor. To accept the received text, one must find a plausible sense in which Aristotle's own view of the soul might suggest the ship-sailor analogy. While some think this is impossible, Shields notes that there are ways in which the analogy could be appropriate (if, for example, the soul is an efficient cause of the body's movements in a way analogous to the sailor's movement of the ship), even if the analogy is misleading in other ways (2016, p. 180). This difference between translations points to a difficult feature of the DA: there are a number of key places where the status of the text itself is in dispute.

Here one advantage of Shields' edition is that he makes use of Pawel Siwek's critical edition of the DA (1965), which reports a number of manuscripts not consulted by either Ross or Jannone, editors of the two most commonly used editions. Siwek makes different editorial choices that those working on the DA should consider, something that I would have liked to see Reeve do. Reeve works from Ross's edition and his textual choices are generally reasonable. When he departs from Ross, he usually provides the translation of the alternative text in the notes, so that the basic differences are at least apparent to the reader.

There is one area in which Reeve's translation of Aristotle is markedly more successful than that of Shields: its rendering of Aristotle's discussion of intellectual activities (especially in DA III 4-8). Reeve uses "the understanding" to translate the noun, ho nous, and then uses "to understand" and correlates for noein and correlates. Reeve concedes that "intellect" for nous has some advantages (fn. 11, p. 75), as understanding is not often used substantivally, making "the understanding" sound somewhat awkward. Nevertheless, "the understanding" makes the connection that exists in Greek between the noun and its verbal correlates clear to the reader. I agree that this is the best overall option for getting across Aristotle's idea of genuinely grasping what something is. It works much better than Shield's use of "reason" and "to reason," which makes noein too discursive (for further consideration of Shields 2016 see Cohoe 2018). Reeves also carefully distinguishes between other intellectual words such as gnoein and dianoeisthai, keeping them more distinct than Shields does. For example, Reeve nicely renders theôresai as "get a theoretical grasp on," getting across Aristotle's technical usage of this verb. (note 3, p. 69)

All in all, Reeve provides readers with an outstanding translation that will help them engage with Aristotle and see how the DA fits within Aristotle's overall thought. Reeve's edition, with its very fine translation, detailed explanatory notes, and thoughtful introduction, provides an excellent way to introduce students to Aristotle's views on living things, helping us to discover the soul as the starting point of life.


Thank you to C.D.C. Reeve for clarifying how the opening sentence of his translation should read.


Cohoe, Caleb (2018), "Review of Aristotle, De Anima: Translation, Introduction, and Commentary, Christopher Shields" Philosophical Quarterly.

Shields, Christopher, trans. and commentary (2016), Aristotle, De Anima. Translation, Introduction, and Commentary, Oxford: Clarendon Aristotle Series.

Siwek, Pawel, ed. and commentary (1965), Tractatus De Anima; Graece et Latine. Rome: Desclée, Editori Pontifici.