De Anima

Placeholder book cover

Aristotle, De Anima, Christopher Shields (tr., intro., comm.), Oxford University Press, 2016, 415pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199243457.

Reviewed by Hendrik Lorenz, Princeton University


"The Clarendon Aristotle series," Christopher Shields writes, "takes as its mission a plain, forthright exposition of Aristotle's philosophy for the engaged Greekless reader rather than the professional philologist" (xlvi f.). In keeping with this mission, the present work offers a substantive introduction, a new translation, a commentary, and a glossary.

The work's introduction begins by briefly describing the topics that Aristotle tackles in his treatise on the soul. Aristotle conceives of the soul (psukhē) as principle of life, as what by its presence is responsible for the various kinds of vital activities that the different kinds of living things engage in. So, Aristotle's topics in the De Anima (DA) include the nature of life, nutrition and reproduction, human and non-human animal cognition, as well as the explanation of animal behavior and human action. Shields' introduction provides a short section on the place of the DA in the Aristotelian corpus, which turns out to deal with the question of at which stage in Aristotle's life he wrote the work. Shields' view is that the DA is a relatively late work of Aristotle's, and that in writing the work Aristotle is presupposing knowledge of technical terms introduced and explained in other treatises, such as the Physics, Metaphysics, and On Generation and Corruption. Beyond this, Shields' introduction does not further address the important question of how the DA relates thematically to Aristotle's other writings, such as the Physics, the Parva Naturalia (which deal with such topics as sense-perception, sleep, dreams, and memory), and the biological writings. Without having thematically placed the DA in the context of Aristotle's philosophy, Shields' introduction proceeds to offer a clear and useful outline of Aristotle's framework of hylomorphic explanation, and of the application of the matter-form distinction to the relationship between a living thing's body and its soul. Lastly, the work's introduction discusses the three main powers or faculties of the soul that Aristotle recognizes, namely the nutritive, perceptual and intellectual powers, summarizing Aristotle's views on these topics and addressing some of the interpretive and philosophical questions they raise.

Shields' translation is less than fully satisfactory. To begin with, there are two regrettable choices that affect many passages of Aristotle's intricate Greek. First, Shields chooses to use the same English words ("actuality" and cognates) to translate two distinct Greek words and their cognates, namely energeia and entelekheia. Several reputable scholars of Aristotle's philosophy have urged that the two Greek words have different meanings and that they should receive different translations (e.g. "activity" on the one hand and "fulfillment" on the other).[1] Shields takes the view that the two words carry the same meaning in the DA. But given that Aristotle uses both words, and given that reputable Aristotelians have argued that they have different meanings, it would have been better if Shields had translated them differently from one another, so as to make visible to Greekless readers at least the possibility of a difference in meaning.

Secondly, Shields' translation choices for Aristotle's words denoting intellectual activities are unfortunate. The most important such words featuring in the DA are noein, dianoeisthai, and logizesthai. These words can differ in meaning from one another, but Shields translates them all in the same way, "to reason." Most importantly, noein can contrast with dianoeisthai. The former can denote an act of mentally grasping something all at once, whereas the latter typically denotes an activity of thinking something through, one mental step at a time. Shields' choice of translating noein (and cognates) as "to reason" sometimes results in needless obscurity. For example, at the beginning of DA III 6, Shields translates Aristotle as saying that "reasoning of indivisible things is among the things concerning which there is no falsity." Aristotle's point is clearer if noēsis is translated as "thinking," as it is by most translators. J. A. Smith translates: "The thinking of indivisibles is found in those cases where falsehood is impossible" (The Complete Works of Aristotle, ed. J. Barnes, 1984). With indivisibles or simples such as the diagonal or the incommensurable (Aristotle's examples), you either grasp them correctly or you are not thinking of them at all. For the alternatives of truth or falsehood to arise, a thinker has to combine indivisibles into complex thoughts, such as the thought that the diagonal is incommensurable.

In a passage in DA I 4 (408b18-29), Aristotle seems to contrast noein ("to grasp in thought") and dianoeisthai ("to think things through"), when he tentatively ascribes the former activity to the power of thought itself (ho nous, the noun that corresponds to the verb noein), whereas he ascribes the activity of thinking things through to the bearer of the power of thought, presumably the person. This apparent contrast is invisible to Shields' Greekless readers, because Shields translates both verbs alike, as "to reason." Again, Shields no doubt thinks that Aristotle intends no such contrast in this passage. However, Aristotle is using two different verbs with potentially different meanings, and it would have been good to put Greekless readers in a position to be able to make up their own minds about the question whether Aristotle intends a contrast between two distinct kinds of activity.

In several passages, Shields' translation is imprecise or needlessly obscure.[2] Here are two examples of significant imprecision in Shields' translation of Aristotle's discussion of sense-perception. In DA II 5, Aristotle discusses sense-perception in general. He treats it as an occurrent activity that consists in being affected by a sense-object such as a color or a sound. A crucial point that Aristotle wants to make in this chapter is that perceiving is an extraordinary way of being altered in that it is non-destructive. Ordinary ways of being altered, for Aristotle, consist in the destruction of a quality and its replacement with another quality from the same range. For example, when honey is added to a bitter drink, the drink's bitterness is replaced with sweetness. By contrast, the alteration that is perceiving is a preservation rather than a destruction and advances the sense towards itself and its fulfillment (417b2-7). Prior to perceiving, the sensory power is inactive. The alteration that is perceiving, Aristotle says, likens the sensory power to the sense-object. At the end of the chapter, Aristotle offers a succinct formulation:

The sensory power is in capacity such as the sense-object is already in fulfillment, as was just said. It gets affected, then, when it is not like the sense-object. But having been affected, it has been likened and is such as the sense-object (418a5-6; translations from the DA are my own unless otherwise indicated).

In describing the sensory power prior to perceiving, Aristotle says that it is not like the sense-object. Earlier in the chapter, when Aristotle recapitulates his theory of acting and being affected from On Generation and Corruption, he describes ordinary alterations in very similar language, but with a noticeable difference. He says about anything that is affected that "what is affected is that which is unlike, but having been affected it is like" (417a20), meaning that the thing that is affected comes to be like what acts on it. For example, honey likens the formerly bitter drink to itself by sweetening it. It may well be significant that Aristotle slightly changes his language from "unlike" (anhomoion) to "not like" (oukh homoion) as he turns from ordinary cases of alteration to the extraordinary alteration that is perceiving. Aristotle's point might be that while in ordinary alterations there is a contrariety between the patient's pre-alteration quality and the quality of the agent, there is no such contrariety, only a lack of likeness,[3] between the inactive sensory power and the sense-object that is about to act on it. This slight, but arguably significant change in Aristotle's language is invisible to Shields' Greekless readers, as he translates both anhomoion ("unlike") and oukh homoion ("not like") in the same way, as "unlike." It would have been better to translate the different expressions differently from one another, allowing readers to make up their minds about the question whether the difference is philosophically significant.

In Aristotle's discussion of the sense of taste in DA II 10, he seems to analyze gustatory perception in terms of two distinct alterations. On the one hand, the gustatory power (in other words, the sense of taste) is likened to a given flavor, sweetness, bitterness, or some intermediate flavor. On the other hand, the organ of taste, the tongue, is moistened. Earlier on in the chapter, Aristotle says that "the body in which flavor, the object of taste, resides is in something moist as in matter" (422a10-11). So when honey hits a perceiver's tongue, Aristotle's analysis of gustatory perception treats two distinct changes as salient: the sense of taste is likened to the honey's sweetness, and the perceiver's tongue is moistened by the matter that houses the sweetness. Given that the tongue must be moistened for gustatory perception to take place, an inactive tongue must be in a specific condition to be in a state of preparedness for operation as the organ of taste:

The organ of taste must be moistened, and must not be moist, but must be what is capable of being moistened while being preserved. (422b3-5)

This sentence is important evidence for ascribing to Aristotle the view that acts of sense-perception are partly constituted by physiological changes undergone by the sense-organs. The sentence thus speaks to a current debate about the form that Aristotle's hylomorphic analysis of sense-perception takes. It militates against Myles Burnyeat's view that Aristotle analyzes perceiving as a purely spiritual (entirely non-physiological) change, so that Aristotle's philosophy of mind turns out to be incredible to post-Cartesian readers.[4] However, you could not tell from Shields' inaccurate translation that the sentence is about a change of specifically the organ of taste: "it is necessary, then, that the sensory faculty of taste, though it is not itself something moist, be capable of being moistened and of being preserved when moistened."

Discussion of Shields' commentary will have to be rather selective. One of the most interesting and much-discussed parts of the DA is the treatment of soul in general and specific types of souls in II 1-3. In II 1, Aristotle offers three general accounts of the soul, culminating in the claim that "if it is necessary to say something which is common to every soul, it would be that the soul is the first fulfillment of an instrumental natural body" (412b4-6). In II 2 and II 3, Aristotle makes clear that the accounts provided in II 1 are not fully satisfactory definitions. His reason for dissatisfaction seems to be that while the accounts so far given state truths about the soul, they fail to contain and make perspicuous the "reason why" -- meaning, the reason why they are true. In II 2 Aristotle offers reasons for thinking that the soul is a fulfillment and form of a body of the relevant kind (as is clear from the chapter's last sentence, 414a27-8). Presumably he also means to show readers how to construct fully satisfactory definitions of the soul, or perhaps rather of the souls of the three main types of living things, namely plants, non-human animals, and humans. Such definitions would contain and make perspicuous the reasons why they are true. In II 3 Aristotle discusses the relations among the different kinds of living things and their defining capacities (nutritive, perceptual, and intellectual). He also makes a remarkable claim about the soul: he says that a common account of it is not peculiar, or proprietary, to any of the things that have being (414b26-7). The implication seems to be that there is no such thing as the soul over and above the main types of souls, namely plant souls, non-human animal souls, and human souls (compare 414b32-3).

Shields' commentary on those three chapters focuses on the questions they raise about Aristotle's soul-body hylomorphism. These chapters contain important evidence about Aristotle's hylomorphism, and it is good that readers of Shields' commentary receive a detailed introduction to the topic. However, readers receive very little help from the commentary with questions about how Aristotle thinks the soul, or souls, should be defined, and about whether Aristotle even thinks that there is such a thing as the soul. The latter question is not the question whether there are souls. Like every other major thinker in ancient Greek philosophy, Aristotle takes it for granted that there are souls. The question is whether the different kinds or types of souls constitute a single kind of thing, in the way the different species of birds might constitute a single genus. This latter question may also have implications for another question: namely, whether there can, on Aristotle's view, be such thing as the science of psychology, a single science that deals with all kinds or types of souls in a unified way, in the way that there might be a single science of ornithology or a single science of botany.

What Shields says in his commentary on those three chapters does not provide readers with nearly enough guidance about Aristotle's project of defining the soul, or the relevant kinds of souls. As we saw, Aristotle begins DA II 2 by saying that progress should be made on the accounts or definitions of the soul that were presented in II 1. A definition, he says, should not only state a truth, but also reveal the reason why it is true. Here is Shields' statement about how II 2-3 relate to II 1: Aristotle "means to suggest that we have already ascertained that the soul exists; now we need to fix its extension and to discover more about its nature" (182). But II 1 is not about "whether the soul exists." That there are souls is never in question for Aristotle. And II 1 is silent about the question whether there is such a thing as the soul conceived of as a single, unified kind of thing. Nor does Aristotle problematize the extension of the soul. He takes it for granted that within the domain of mortal things, it is in plants, non-human animals and humans that souls are to be found, and he takes the considerations provided in II 1 to establish that souls are the substantial forms and first fulfillments of the various kinds of living things.

It is true that Aristotle in DA II 2-3 aims to discover more about the nature of soul or souls. But Shields does not explain how these two chapters concern the natures of souls. Here is the explanation that Shields does not provide. In DA II 2, Aristotle aims not only to shed light on the reason or explanation why the accounts of soul provided in II 1 are true. He also means to show his readers how to construct definitions of souls that contain and reveal those reasons or explanations. Since Aristotle conceives of definitions as statements that reveal the nature of the thing defined, to discover definitions that are more informative and explanatory is to discover more about the nature of the things that are being defined. That Aristotle means to show readers how to construct definitions that contain the reasons why the accounts provided in II 1 are true emerges from his comparison between defining soul and defining the geometrical task of squaring a rectangle with unequal adjacent sides. Shields' commentary on this comparison is brief and confusing (182-183).[5] Shields correctly ascribes to Aristotle the view that "it is appropriate to seek a syllogism, or series of syllogisms, explaining the facts about the soul thus far adduced" (183). He adds that "nowhere in De Anima does he in fact produce these sorts of syllogisms pertaining to the soul" (183). Shields does not explore the possibility that in DA II 2-3 Aristotle means to provide readers with the resources needed to produce syllogisms that explain the truth of the accounts offered in II 1. (That he means to do so is strongly suggested by the comparison between defining souls and defining the geometrical task of squaring, which Aristotle seems to think can be done in a way that reveals the reason or explanation why the relevant square is equal in area to the relevant rectangle.) Furthermore, Aristotle is interested in producing syllogisms that explain the facts about the soul so far adduced in order to be able to construct better definitions of the soul, or of the different kinds of soul. Shields's commentary offers no guidance about what such definitions might look like, and how they might relate to the accounts of the soul offered in II 1.

In his commentary on DA II 3, Shields rightly says about the chapter's comparison between kinds of animate creatures (plants, animals, humans) and the series of geometrical figures (triangles, quadrangles, etc.) that a lesson Aristotle means to draw from the comparison "concerns the soul's general definability, a result which colours the various accounts of the soul advanced in the last two chapters" (191). However, Shields' commentary does not directly answer the question whether the soul as such is definable, according to Aristotle. He rightly points out that it is mistake to think that Aristotle in DA II 3 rules out the possibility of "a general account of soul as such" (195). As Shields adds, "any such contention would be jarring immediately after Aristotle has just himself provided not one but several general accounts of the soul," namely in DA II 1. However, a general account of the soul is not necessarily a definition of the soul, let alone an adequate definition of the soul. Shields' commentary does not offer any discussion of Aristotle's remarkable claim in DA II 3 that a common account of the soul would not be an account proprietary to any of the things that have being (414b26-7). The implication seems to be that there is no such thing as the soul as such, by contrast with the human soul, the non-human animal soul, and the plant soul (414b32-3). But if there is no such thing as the soul, and if to be adequate, a definition must latch on to something real (in that it must be an account of something that as such has being), then there cannot be an adequate definition of the soul as such. This is compatible with thinking that there can be a general account of the soul -- an account that explicates what the soul is and that applies to all the various kinds of souls.

Furthermore, if the soul as such is not adequately definable because it is not a properly unified kind of thing, this raises the question whether there can, for Aristotle, be a science of psychology, a single science that deals with the soul and its attributes. Shields seems to think that there is, for Aristotle, such a science, and he seems to treat the DA as at least a partial exposition of that science. That this is Shields' view is suggested by his comments on DA I 1. He writes of Aristotle's "science of psychology" (100) and claims that Aristotle "tentatively introduces psychology as a form of natural science" (80). On Shields' view, Aristotle is tentative not about whether study of soul in all its varieties can amount to a single science, but about the question whether the science of psychology belongs to natural philosophy, given the special status and possible separation from matter of the intellect (100).

If the study of soul in general does not and cannot amount to a single science, what is Aristotle up to in the DA? One might think that Aristotle's purpose in the DA is largely dialectical, in that he means to reason from apparent truths and reputable opinions to propositions about the soul and about the various kinds of soul that might serve as principles in sciences that fall within natural philosophy, such as botany, zoology, and scientific anthropology.[6] The DA raises the questions whether there is such a thing as the soul as such; whether the soul is properly definable, as opposed to explicable; whether there is such a thing as a science of psychology; and if not, what Aristotle is up to in the DA. These are central and pressing questions about Aristotle's project in the DA. It is surprising that few of them get raised and none of them get adequately addressed either in Shields' introduction or in his commentary.

Given the shortcomings of Shields' translation and the thematic unevenness of the introduction and commentary, the book will probably not become the central guide to Aristotle's philosophical project in the DA, in the way that some other volumes in the Clarendon Aristotle series have become central guides to their texts (for example, Jonathan Barnes' volume on the Posterior Analytics, or Michael Woods' on books I, II, and VIII of the Eudemian Ethics). That said, students of Aristotle's psychology, especially those primarily interested in Aristotle's hylomorphism and its application to living things and their activities will benefit from studying Shields' volume.

[1] For example, J. Beere, Doing and Being (Oxford, 2009), 218-19; A. Kosman, The Activity of Being (Cambridge, 2013), vii-x.

[2] More examples of needless obscurity: DA II 2, 414a4-6, where the dative expressions are first translated as "by X" and then as "by means of X," when there is no corresponding change of expression in Aristotle's Greek; DA III 9, 432a24-6, where Shields' translation is puzzling both as a translation of Aristotle's Greek and as a piece of English.

[3] One might compare Aristotle's distinction in Nicomachean Ethics III 1 between what is involuntary (akousion) and what is not voluntary (oukh hekousion).

[4] M. Burnyeat, "Is an Aristotelian Philosophy of Mind Still Credible? A Draft," in Nussbaum and Rorty (eds.), Essays on Aristotle's De Anima (Oxford, 1992), 15-26.

[5] Contrary to what Shields says on p. 182, Aristotle does not, in commenting on squaring, have in mind the two Euclidean figures Shields provides: Figure 2 is from Euclid, Elements II 4, which is a good deal more complicated than the operation Aristotle has in mind in DA II 2. Shields' formulation of Aristotle's conclusion about squaring -- "that AB and BC will have a line equal to BD" (183) -- does not make sense.

[6] That Aristotle's project in the DA is largely dialectical is suggested by R. Polansky in the introduction to his commentary on the DA (Cambridge, 2007: 19-24).