De Lingua Belief

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Robert Fiengo and Robert May, De Lingua Belief, MIT Press, 2006, 179pp., $32.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262062577.

Reviewed by Gary Ostertag, Nassau Community College


Philosophers of language have obsessed about the semantics of belief reports at least since Frege stated his famous substitutivity puzzle in the opening pages of "On Sense and Reference".  Approaching Frege's Puzzle opens the door to a host of issues -- questions of compositionality emerge, as do questions regarding the nature of propositions, the semantics of proper names, and the logical form of belief reports.  And as if that weren't enough, at some point -- rather late in the day, as it happened -- it became apparent that a solution would require settling questions regarding context-sensitivity and where to draw the semantics/pragmatics divide.  It is rarely thought, however, that questions regarding our beliefs about the identity and difference of linguistic expressions need to be sorted out before a satisfactory resolution to the puzzle is to be arrived at.  In their important new study, Robert Fiengo and Robert May contend that this is an oversight, and that a proper resolution to the belief puzzles put forward by Frege and Kripke can only be achieved by getting clear on the content of certain beliefs about language.  These are the de lingua beliefs of their title.[1]

Fiengo and May argue that certain meta-linguistic attitudes play an essential role in the interpretation of belief reports and identity statements.  The contents of the relevant attitudes concern the semantic values of names and their syntactic identity (3).  The content of a belief regarding the semantic value of (the use of)[2] a name such as "Max" is represented as an assignment: informally, that "Max" has the value Max.  The belief that the tokening of a name, relative to a discourse, is type-identical (in a sense presently to be made clear) to another tokening of the same name and type-distinct from yet another tokening of the same name is represented by numerical subscripts, or indices.[3]  The type-identity in question is, in the book's terminology, expression-type identity.

Names vs. Expressions

The name-type "Max" is a lexical item.  According to Fiengo and May, the name-type doesn't refer; only expressions in which the name "Max" occurs refer.  An expression-type ("expression", for short), in their terminology, is an item in the syntactic representation of a sentence.  For example, "Max is late" can be represented (as a first pass) as: [Max] is late.  Here, the bracketed item is an expression.  Of course, it's hard to see how this item is any more capable of referring than the name-type.  What Fiengo and May appear to mean is that an expression refers only when it occurs in the formal representation of a given utterance.  What refers is an "employed lexical item" (146).  The idea here is that "[Max]" as it occurs in a syntactic representation R refers only insofar as R represents the tokening of "Max is late" within a discourse.  "To avoid confusion, we must distinguish names, which have bearers, from the occurrences of expressions containing names in discourse, which have referents" (13-4).  So, occurring in a discourse (or, more accurately, in the formalization of a bit of discourse) is crucial to reference.[4]

Rather than claim that there are many name-types with the phonological spelling of "Max", one for each bearer, [5] Fiengo and May hold that there is only one such name-type.  To distinguish among distinct expression-types exemplifying the same name-type (for example, different uses of "Max" within a discourse), Fiengo and May employ numerical subscripts.[6]  "[Max1]" corresponds to one such type, "[Max2]" to another.  These expression-types constitute the domain of the assignment function (expressed informally as: [NPX] has the value NP).[7]

The Belief Puzzles

According to Fiengo and May, the content of (1) "John believes Cicero was a Roman" is (1a), whereas the content of (2) "John believes Tully was a Roman" is (2a):

(1a) John believes [[Cicero1 was a Roman] and ["Cicero1" has the value Cicero1]]

(2a) John believes [[Tully1 was a Roman] and ["Tully1" has the value Tully1]]

Assume that John has read a fair amount of Roman history in translation:  He believes that Cicero was a Roman and that Cicero's English name is "Cicero".  Although he knows that Tully (Cicero) lived in antiquity and that Tully's English name is "Tully" he does not believe that Tully was a Roman.  Relative to these assumptions, (1) is true, (2) is false.  But Fiengo and May's analyses fail to recapitulate the intuition that (2) is false.  To see this, consider (1b) and (2b):

(1b) ∃x ("Cicero" has the value x & x = Cicero & x was a Roman)

(2b) ∃x ("Tully" has the value x & x = Tully & x was a Roman)

These formulae seem to capture the content of the bracketed material in (1a)/(2a).  As Fiengo and May write, in (1) "John is said to have a single belief, which, as it happens, is expressed as the conjunction of two sentences.  And for him to have that belief it must be the case that he believe that one person [namely, Cicero] was a Roman and referred to by the "Cicero"-expression" (64; emphasis in text).  This gloss is captured perfectly by (1b).[8]  (Similar remarks hold for (2)/(2b).)  Now (1b) is equivalent to: (1c) "Cicero" has the value Cicero & Cicero was a Roman.  And (2b) is equivalent to: (2c) "Tully" has the value Tully & Tully was a Roman.  But then John (relative to our assumptions) believes (2c): he believes that "Tully" has the value Tully and he believes that Tully (i.e., Cicero) was a Roman (he wouldn't use those words, but that's another matter).  But as we've noted, (2) is false.  So, assuming (2b) captures the proposition attributed in (2a), (2a) can't be the correct analysis of (2).

There are also problems with the proposal's handling of negative belief reports, sentences exemplifying 'A doesn't believe p.'  Let's focus on the de dicto use of (3):

(3) John doesn't believe that Tully was a Roman.

An adequate analysis of this use must capture its de dicto character and at the same time reflect the fact that it contradicts the de dicto use of (2).  But there is no acceptable analysis of (3) consistent with Feingo and May's proposal that does both.

Within their framework, the obvious first-pass analysis of (3) is (3a):

(3a) John does not believe [[Tully1 was a Roman] and ["Tully1" has the value Tully1]]

It is clear that (3a) explicitly contradicts (2a), which does capture the de dicto use of (2).  Yet, it should be equally clear that (3a) fails to capture the de dicto use of (3), given that the truth of (3a) is compatible with John's not believing the assignment: "Tully1" has the value Tully1.  But belief in this assignment is essential to the utterance's de dicto character.

On the other hand, an analysis that succeeds in capturing the de dicto use of (3), namely (3c), is not available on Fiengo and May's account:

(3c) John does not believe [Tully1 was a Roman] and John believes ["Tully1" has the value Tully1]

On their view, believing a conjunction is not equivalent to believing its conjuncts; in asserting (2) "one belief is attributed" to the subject (64).  Presumably, the same goes for negative belief reports: if (2) ascribes belief in a single proposition, (3) ascribes disbelief in a single proposition.  This, of course, is reasonable.  Acceptable analyses of the de dicto use of (2) and (3) (at least those uses in which the utterance of (2) contradicts the utterance of (3)) should preserve the intuition that both utterances concern the same proposition.

The larger issue concerns the viability of the conjunctive analysis of de dicto belief.  If a de dicto report attributes belief in P & A (where A is an assignment) then contradicting that report should simply consist in a denial of belief in P & A.  But whereas one can use a negative de dicto belief report to deny belief in P, one cannot use a negative de dicto belief report to deny belief in A (to do so is incompatible with the report's being de dicto).  This suggests that the conjunctive analysis is incorrect -- that A is not part of what is asserted.[9]

There is also a more general worry regarding this sort of treatment.  In construing de dicto reports as involving the attribution of an assignment, the proposal is vulnerable to an important criticism of meta-linguistic accounts of attitude ascription, due to Jennifer Saul (1998).  Imagine a woman, Nicole, who comes to have a crush on Superman after observing him from a distance at various cocktail parties but who is at the same time rather indifferent to his alter ego, Clark Kent.  Nicole is new to Metropolis and so hasn't learned that Superman in his superhero persona is referred to as "Superman" (she is a little hard of hearing); nor has she learned that he is referred to as "Clark Kent" in his nerdy-reporter persona. Indeed, she hasn't referred to him (relative to either persona) in conversation at all.  Intuitively, then, (4) is true and (5) false:

(4) Nicole believes that Superman is witty and urbane.

(5) Nicole believes that Clark Kent is witty and urbane.

But now consider (5).  According to the analysis of the de dicto reading, Nicole believes that someone, namely Clark Kent, is witty and urbane and the value of "Clark Kent".  This, however, attributes a belief in an assignment (that "Clark Kent" has the value Clark Kent), that Nicole, by stipulation, doesn't have.  Moreover, if the assignment is not part of the attributed content, then Fiengo and May are incapable of explaining the intuition that (5) is false.

A related issue concerns embedded occurrences of pronouns.  Let's extend the above example, adding that Nicole has uttered "He's dull" at a party, referring to Clark Kent.  Surely, then, (6) is false, relative to the context discussed (assuming "he" refers to Clark Kent relative to his reporter persona):

(6) Nicole believes that he1 is witty and urbane.

Fiengo and May must explain its falsity by claiming that the speaker asserts a de dicto report, analyzed as follows:

(6a) Nicole believes [[Clark Kent is witty and urbane] and ["he1" has the value Clark Kent]]

But it is unclear what "he1" represents and thus to what the assignment function assigns a value.  Surely it's not the lexical item "he"; but it's also implausible to assume that it represents the speaker's usage of the pronoun to refer to Clark Kent (surely Nicole has no beliefs about that).  A final possibility is that the speaker, in using "he", mimics Nicole's use -- "he1" represents Nicole's use of "he" to refer to Clark Kent.  Thus, the assignment attributes a value to Nicole's usage of "he".  It is hard to believe that a speaker, in uttering (6), could have a reasonable expectation of being understood as mimicking Nicole's usage.  But then it is hard to believe that he could thereby intend to mean the proposition expressed by (6a), interpreted as assigning a value to Nicole's usage.[10]

The treatment of Kripke's Puzzle also raises worries.  Fiengo and May adhere to a plausible principle called Singularity -- the requirement that a speaker cannot have two co-spelled names in her idiolect for (what she believes to be) the same person.  In the framework of the book, Singularity implies that a speaker can have "[Max1]" and "[Max2]" in her idiolect only if she believes that the respective expressions are not co-valued.

Consider a subject, John, who mistakenly takes (what he believes to be) distinct co-spelled names to refer to distinct entities.  According to Fiengo and May, a speaker, in ascribing a de dicto belief to John may mimic his state of mind.  To see how this works, let's remind ourselves of the situation: John believes that Paderewski, the renowned pianist, is musically gifted, but John doesn't believe that Paderewski, the statesman, is musically gifted.  That is, the following both are true:

(7) John believes that Paderewski is musically gifted.

(8) John doesn't believe that Paderewski is musically gifted.

The speaker, in relating a relatively straightforward situation, ends up contradicting herself.  Not so, claim Fiengo and May.  (7) and (8) get analyzed as follows:

(7a) John believes [[Paderewski1 is musically gifted] and ["Paderewski1" has the value Paderewski1]]

(8a) John doesn't believe [[Paderewski2 is musically gifted] and ["Paderewski2" has the value Paderewski2]][11]

Why would the speaker use different co-spelled expressions to refer to one and the same person?  Given Singularity, and given the speaker's belief that the "Paderewski" expression-types occurring in (7)/(8) are co-valued, shouldn't they be co-indexed?  In fact, what happens is that the speaker attributes assignments to John that she, the speaker, doesn't believe.  This solves the puzzle: on this rendering, (7a) and (8a) "say nothing inconsistent about John, since the beliefs attributed to John are distinguished" (72).

I find the treatment unsatisfactory for two reasons.  First, given that Paderewski1 = Paderewski2 it follows that John believes both ["Paderewski1" has the value Paderewski2] and ["Paderewski2" has the value Paderewski2].  But then it would follow that John, who is fully rational, believes that there is some x, namely Paderewski2, such that x is the bearer of both "Paderewski1" and "Paderewski2" -- contra Singularity.  So it seems that the analysis does not in fact capture John's beliefs, which, by hypothesis, accord with Singularity.  The result is that there can be only one "Paderewski" expression-type occurring in (7a) and (8a) (this situation can be represented by erasing all the subscripts in (7a) and (8a)).  But then our speaker contradicts herself after all.

Perhaps the damaging inference can be blocked.  One might, for example, object to my substitution of non-quotational occurrences of "Paderewski1" for "Paderewski2" in a belief context: 'Just because John believes that Paderewski1 is such-and-such doesn't mean he believes that Paderewski2 is such-and-such.'  But Fiengo and May claim that their analysis "is not itself subject to further analysis" (94n).  That is, (7a) analyzes, but is not itself, a de dicto context.  Of course this makes sense -- if the context in (7a) were de dicto (such that substitution of "Paderewski2" for "Paderewski1" in "[Paderewski1 is musically gifted]" failed) then it would hardly constitute a successful analysis of (7).  But if it's not de dicto in their (or any other) sense then they are not in a position to deny the validity of the above-cited substitution.[12]

Second, this solution faces a problem that also affects Fregean solutions to Kripke's Puzzle: it is simply hard to believe that the speaker's language tracks the subject's belief state as precisely as the analysis requires.  The Fregean might claim that (7) asserts that John believes that Paderewski1 is musically gifted (where "Paderewski1" presents Paderewski as a famous pianist) and that (8) asserts that John does not believe that Paderewski2 is musically gifted (where "Paderewski2" presents Paderewski as a Polish statesman).  Contradiction avoided.  But this is implausible.  It is ad hoc to suppose that, in an enlightened context (i.e., where speaker and hearer are apprised of John's confusion), the speaker shifts the meaning assigned to "Paderewski" in order to mimic the subject's state of mind.  But then it is equally ad hoc to suppose that, in an enlightened context, the speaker shifts the subscripts (so to speak) to mimic the subject's usage.

Identity Statements

Frege argued that identity statements such as (9) cannot be construed as asserting a relation between objects, since this would fail to capture the fact that such sentences can extend our knowledge.

(9) Superman is Clark Kent.

He also argued that a meta-linguistic analysis of such contexts must fail as well.  Intuitively, part of what (9) conveys is that "Superman" and "Clark Kent" co-refer.  But this linguistic information does not exhaust the semantic content of (9), which presumably involves the individual, Superman/Kent, and the identity relation.

Fiengo and May's treatment of identity statements is continuous with their analysis of belief reports.  Like belief reports, identity statements come in two varieties: de dicto and non-de dicto.  Informative identity statements are de dicto, trivial ones are non-de dicto.  As with a de dicto belief report, the content of a de dicto identity statement involves assignments of values to expressions.  According to Fiengo and May, construing the informative use of (9) as de dicto will provide an analysis that respects the intuition that it is both object-involving (being about Superman/Clark Kent) and expression-involving (containing the information that "Superman" and "Clark Kent" co-refer).

On the proposed analysis, (9) will express either (9a) or (9b), depending on the context:

(9a) Superman1 = Clark Kent2

(9b) Superman1 = Clark Kent2 & "Superman1" has the value Superman1 & "Clark Kent2" has the value Clark Kent2.

(9b) captures the informative, "de dicto" use, (9a), the uninformative (and comparatively rare), non-de dicto use.  Note that (9b) is both object-involving and expression-involving, as required.  And while the crucial "knowledge extending" information, (10), isn't, strictly speaking, contained in (9b), a minimally rational agent will be capable of deriving it from (9b):

(10) "Superman1" and "Clark Kent2" co-refer.

(As Fiengo and May point out, (10) does not directly extend our non-meta-linguistic knowledge, but adding it to our beliefs will bring about such an extension (105-6).)

The analysis fails to provide a satisfactory analysis of the informative (de dicto) use of (9), however.  A minimally rational agent will not necessarily be capable of deriving the proposition (10) from the proposition (9b).  Perhaps, for example, she believes (9b) in virtue of accepting the sentence (9c):

(9c) Superman1 = Superman1 & "Superman1" has the value Superman1 & "Clark Kent2" has the value Clark Kent2.

If so, she will not conclude that (10) is true, since she will not be able to conclude that the respective assignments assign the same value to the relevant expressions.  But then (9) has not been shown to be informative: the proposition expressed by (9b) cannot, by itself, extend our knowledge, or even bring about such an extension.

Indeed, it appears that Lois herself believes (9b), relative to the fictional context.  Presumably there is nothing more to the propositional content of (9a), which is non-de dicto, than to the propositional content of either 'Superman1 = Superman1' or 'Clark Kent2 = Clark Kent2'.  So, because Lois believes these identities, she must believe (9a) -- the first conjunct of (9b).  Moreover, she clearly believes the assignments provided in the second and third conjuncts of (9b).  So it would appear that she believes (9b).  But then the analysis can't be right after all, since it is supposed to capture something that Lois does not believe -- something that, when added to her current set of beliefs, would cause her to be disposed to assent to (e.g.) "Clark Kent flies" and to behave in a manner consistent with her newly-formed linguistic dispositions.[13]

Finally, statements of non-identity present problems (similar to those surrounding the analysis of disbelief reports).  Consider the proposition expressed by a de dicto use of (11) 'Superman ≠ Clark Kent.'  This proposition should contradict (9b), which is intended to capture the de dicto use of (9).  But, to be de dicto, the analysis of (11) must be of the following form:

(11a) Superman1 ≠ Clark Kent2 & "Superman1" has the value Superman1 & "Clark Kent2" has the value Clark Kent2.

It is clear, however, that (11a) doesn't contradict (9b) -- the propositions can be simultaneously false (this will be the case, for example, if one of the shared assignments is false).  Yet, the de dicto use of (9) and the de dicto use of (11) cannot be simultaneously false.


The authors have provided a sophisticated treatment of an important topic, arguing that the proper analysis of certain linguistic contexts (belief reports and identity statements) requires an understanding of certain of our linguistic beliefs.  De dicto utterances, on their view, convey information regarding assignments of values to expressions and consequently presuppose information regarding the identity and distinctness of these expressions.  The discussion of these matters is subtle and illuminating.  I have indicated where I think the discussion is unsatisfying and where I think more needs to be said.  But no treatment of belief reports and identity statements can be exempted from this sort of rough handling.  My criticisms should not detract from the fact that this book makes a serious and original contribution to a central area in philosophy of language.  It will be required reading for anyone interested in issues clustering around Frege's Puzzle, Kripke's Puzzle and the semantics of identity statements.


Fiengo, R. and R. May. (1994) Indices and Identity. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Green, M. (1998) "Direct Reference and Implicature." Philosophical Studies 91: 61-90.

Larson, L. and P. Ludlow. "Interpreted logical forms." Synthese 95: 305-355.

Salmon, N. (1986a) Frege's Puzzle. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Salmon, N. (1986b) "Reflexivity." Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 27: 401-429.

Saul, J. (1998) "The Pragmatics of Attitude Ascription." Philosophical Studies 92: 363-89.

Strawson, P. F. (1950) "On Referring."  Mind 59: 320-44.

[1] In fact, the idea that belief reports convey meta-linguistic information is not entirely new.  In particular, Fiengo and May's thesis that "syntactic entities play the mode of presentation role" (51) is already developed in Salmon (1986a) and (1986b) (see his discussion of "propositional guises") and critiqued in Saul (1998) and Green (1998).  There are sententialist theories of belief reports as well, in which reference to propositions is eschewed altogether, in favor of linguistic entities such as "interpreted logical forms"; see Larson and Ludlow (1993).  That said, the framework presented here, including the capacity to distinguish different uses of phonologically co-spelled names, goes beyond these earlier treatments.

[2] By the use of a name I mean, using Fiengo and May's terminology, the tokening, within a discourse, of an expression type in which the name occurs.

[3] Although thematically continuous with Indices and Identity (Fiengo and May, 1994), the treatment of names presented here is entirely new.

[4] Although they sometimes write as if the pattern of usage they intend the bracketing to capture extends beyond a given discourse.  For example, they write that there exists a "social contract" (among speakers of English) to use "[Russell]" to refer to Bertrand Russell (85). 

[5] On this view the name-type "Max" is multiply ambiguous: there are many names with the same phonological spelling, all referring to different bearers.  It seems to me that this view is compatible with the analyses that Fiengo and May provide in their discussion of belief reports: each disambiguation of "Max" corresponds to a differently subscripted expression.  Moreover, this view makes better sense of the idea (discussed below) that de dicto reports attribute assignments.  Rather than say that part of what I do in uttering (1), below, is to mimic John's usage of "Cicero" (or to claim that John believes that my use of "Cicero" relative to a given discourse has the value Cicero) we can simply say that, for a particular disambiguation of the type "Cicero" (the one used when discussing the Catilinian conspiracy, say), John believes that it has the value Cicero.

Fiengo and May do consider such a view, but reject it principally on the ground that it is incompatible with the apparent truth of the sentence (C): "There are many people named Cicero" (146).  This appears true, but is false according to the ambiguity theory.  But until we know what it means for several people to bear the same name, it seems premature to make a judgment on the truth or falsity of (C).  Perhaps it is false. 

[6] Of course this is only necessary when distinct expression-types exemplify the same name-type within a given discourse (e.g., when different uses of "Max" occur within the same discourse).  

[7] The implied classification {name-type, name-token, expression-type} corresponds to one put forward by Strawson (1950) involving linguistic type (the lexical item), linguistic token (a concrete instance of a lexical item), and the use made of the type, relative to a given period of time, to refer to a given individual (e.g., the use of "the king of France" to refer, during his reign, to Louis XIV).  Fiengo and May's understanding of "expression type" appears to be inspired by, and closely related to, Strawson's concept of "use".

[8] Note, however, that Fiengo and May claim that (1a) is not equivalent to:

 (*) John believes [Cicero was a Roman] and John believes ["Cicero" has the value Cicero]

In fact, they seem even to deny that (1a) implies (*) (64).  But this is extremely puzzling.  Surely it follows from (1a) that John has a belief about Cicero's nationality and a belief about his name. 

[9] This is not to deny that meta-linguistic information can be part of the content of a belief report.  One might, for example, hold that a de dicto use of (2) is true just in case John believes that Cicero was a Roman when that proposition is presented to him via the sentence "Cicero was a Roman."  This provides information regarding how John believes the ascribed proposition without attributing to him belief in an assignment.

[10] Fiengo and May do take up demonstratives on 158-68, showing how an utterance of "that guy is that guy" can be informative.  While I find their account persuasive, I don't see how it can be incorporated into an account of de dicto belief, one that supplies the intuitively correct analysis for both the imagined utterance of (6) and of "Nicole believes that that guy is witty and urbane" (where, as with (6), "that guy" refers to Clark Kent relative to his reporter persona). 

[11] Note that (8b) is intended to capture the de dicto reading of (8a), but this reading requires that John believes ["Paderewski2" has the value Paderewski2], something not guaranteed by the truth of (8a).  (See the discussion above of (3).)  What is needed is an analysis truth-conditionally equivalent to the conjunction:

John doesn't believe [Paderewski2 is musically gifted] and John believes ["Paderewski2" has the value Paderewski2]

However, as I've indicated, this particular analysis is unavailable to Fiengo and May. 

[12] Perhaps there is something about the use of coordinated subscripts in sentences flanking a conjunction that bars free substitution of co-referring terms.  But I'm not sure what, exactly, the intended restriction is (Don't simplify conjunctions of the form: … [NP1] … & … [NP1] … ?) nor what the motivation for such a restriction might be.  The danger with restricting the kinds of inferences that can be drawn from the belief attributed in, say, (7a) is that it then becomes unclear how to understand the analysis.  If and doesn't simplify then how do I know when the proposition [[Paderewski1 is musically gifted] and ["Paderewski1" has the value Paderewski1]] is true?

[13] One candidate for the proposition expressed by an informative use of (9), not considered by Fiengo and May, is the following:

λxλy (x = y & "Superman1" has the value x & "Clark Kent2" has the value y) (Superman1, Clark Kent1)

This proposition captures the informative use of (9).  In addition, it captures the intuition that (9) contains meta-linguistic information and at the same time is about Superman/Kent.