Deadly Vices

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Gabriele Taylor, Deadly Vices, Oxford University Press, 2006, 170pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0198235801.

Reviewed by Tom Hurka, University of Toronto


Philosophical writing about virtue is of two broad types. One offers detailed analyses of particular virtues and vices, identifying their distinctive psychological elements and behavioural manifestations. The other involves more abstract theorizing about what virtue is, or about the shared features that make the virtues virtues and vices vices. Like her earlier work on virtue, Gabriele Taylor's Deadly Vices is primarily of the first, more fine-grained type, and is a first-rate exemplar of it. But it is also guided by, and meant to support, a neo-Aristotelian theory of virtue according to which the virtues are those traits a person needs in order to flourish.

Taylor's subject is the vices, more specifically those associated with the traditional list of seven deadly sins. Her central chapters therefore give careful analyses of sloth, envy and covetousness, pride and anger, and gluttony and lust. A highlight of her discussions is the illuminating distinctions she draws between forms these vices can take. Thus sloth has one form of indolence, where you think various activities would be worthwhile but find their demands too hard to fulfil, and another of boredom, where you find nothing at all worthwhile. Anger can be either aggressive or resentful, while other vices are even more multiform. As in her earlier Pride, Shame, and Guilt, Taylor distinguishes between vanity, concerned above all with others' opinion of you, conceit, concerned with being better than they are, and arrogance, a form of pride so self-contained it is completely indifferent to others. For envy there is an initial distinction between object-envy, focused on the good another person has, and state-envy, focused on the comparative fact that he has it and you do not; within state-envy there are then both emulative envy, where you try to remove the disparity by acquiring a similar good yourself, and destructive envy, where you try to destroy the other's good.

But she also connects the vices in surprising ways. She notes that there is a kind of restless busyness that looks the antithesis of sloth but rests on a similar inability to find anything worth committing to; the same incapacity appears in the rush from woman to woman of a serial seducer like Don Juan. And she uses her analyses to make persuasive evaluative distinctions, arguing for example that resentful anger is more vicious than aggressive anger, and, among the forms of envy, state-envy worse than object-envy, and destructive envy worse than emulative.

Along the way she makes some use of the philosophical literature on the vices, though perhaps less than one might expect. But she spends considerable time discussing characters from literary fiction. Her choices are often the natural ones -- Oblomov for sloth, Iago for envy, Silas Marner for avarice -- but they illustrate her analyses effectively. A reader may wonder whether in developing her insights she also relied on introspection; if she did, she was only noticing within herself traits that are more present in all of us than we care to admit.

Taylor is guided throughout by the neo-Aristotelian view, first promoted by Elizabeth Anscombe, that the virtues are traits a person needs to flourish, and the vices traits harmful to flourishing. And she understands this view in an uncompromising way.  Unlike some others, she does not equate a flourishing life with one containing all the intrinsic goods and then just assert that the virtues are good. For her the standard of benefit that identifies the virtues and vices cannot be external to the agent's desires but must be one he can recognize from within his current motivations. Her general aim therefore is to show that the various vices frustrate the achievement of an uncontroversial good such as happiness, and do so more specifically by systematically blocking the fulfilment of the very desires from which they spring.

With a partial exception for sloth, her analyses therefore follow a common pattern. A person with a given vice starts with a reasonable and even unproblematic motivation: the miser wants a position in the world that's secure from all threats, the envier wants an esteem-worthy self, and the glutton wants nourishment and warmth. But in each case he has false beliefs about what will achieve his end and therefore pursues it in ways that cannot succeed. The miser's accumulating ever more wealth only means there is more for others to steal; the envier's destroying his rival's good does nothing to make himself more estimable, and chocolate cannot really warm. The result in each case is a self-defeating cycle of desire and frustration, desire and frustration, with the result that the initial goal is never achieved.

Since this cycle starts from a false belief about what will achieve one's goal, Taylor's view has similarities to the Socratic view that all vice rests on ignorance. But it is much more psychologically realistic. For Taylor the vicious person's failing is not purely cognitive; it results from self-deception and ultimately a lack of courage. It is because he cannot face up to the fact that all life involves risk or that his current self is not esteem-worthy that he persuades himself that accumulating money or destroying others' goods will achieve his aim. It is the lack of will to look honestly at his current condition that leads to the self-defeating cycle.

Taylor's analyses show how subtly and pervasively the vices can harm their possessors. In doing so they develop the neo-Aristotelian view further, and take it more seriously, than perhaps anyone else has done. But they also highlight, if inadvertently, what a counterintuitive view that is.

If the key feature of vice, the one that makes the vices vicious, is its frustrating its possessor's desires, then our primary response to vice as vice should surely be pity. 'He's arrogant and condescending, the poor man,' we should say. Or 'She wants our happy marriage to end -- how awful for her.' Now if we believe the vices can harm their possessors -- and one cannot finish Taylor's book without having that belief strengthened -- then we may indeed feel some pity for a vicious person. But that is surely not our principal reaction to his vice, and surely not the one we have to it as vice. Our principal reaction is hatred, with the more specific forms of anger at vices like arrogance and envy and contempt for ones like gluttony and sloth.

And this point is strengthened if we consider a vice omitted from Taylor's central chapters, namely malice, or the desire to cause another pain just for its own sake. Malice, strangely, is not on the traditional list of deadly sins, perhaps because it is also excluded from classical accounts of vice such as Aristotle's. (His doctrine of the mean implies that every vice is the excess or deficiency of a feeling that in some other form would be virtuous -- but there is no virtuous form of malice.) Malice is arguably the worst of the vices, and therefore the central case of vice, yet it is surely not made such by its effects on the malicious person. And our principal response to malice, say to a sadistic torturer's glee in his victim's pain, is hardly pity.

It is not that Taylor ignores malice. In a chapter following her central ones, she argues that the vices she has analyzed are 'capital vices,' in the sense that they spawn other, successor vices, among which she includes cruelty or malice. (She likewise argues, in a concluding chapter, that the chief corrective to her vices is a loving concern for others that takes one beyond the self-concern that is the root of the vices' harm to one's flourishing.) And she labels cruelty a distinctively 'moral' vice because it harms other people. But if she retains her general view that what makes any vice such is the harm it causes its possessor -- and there is no indication that she does not -- she seems committed to holding that malice is vicious primarily because it makes the person who feels it unhappy, and that is surely not the intuitive view.

Whatever its other merits, then, the neo-Aristotelian view seems at odds with everyday thought about virtue and vice. And an alternative view seems much closer. It takes the virtues to involve attitudes (in a broad sense of attitudes) that are appropriate to the values of their objects and therefore good, while the vices involve attitudes that are inappropriate and evil. Thus if another's pain is evil, the negative attitude of wanting to end it and being pained by it is virtuous, while the positive attitude of taking pleasure in it is evil. This alternative view makes malice straightforwardly vicious, and it can also capture the more self-regarding virtues Taylor discusses if it adds that appropriate attitudes must be proportioned to their objects' degrees of value. Thus pride is a vice because it involves being much more pleased by one's own achievements than by the similar achievements of others, while gluttony cares more about the pleasures of eating than their value compared to other goods makes appropriate.

This non-Aristotelian view explains why our primary response to the vices should be hatred rather than pity: as themselves evil they call for a negative response. But in doing so the view applies an evaluative standard that is external to a person's own desires. It assumes that other people's pain is evil whether she is moved by that pain or not, and that gustatory pleasure has little value no matter how keenly she wants it. But that kind of external standard seems implicit in everyday thought about virtue, and it would take a powerful philosophical argument to bring it into doubt.

Moreover, given this view we can question whether the vices always do have the comparatively benign origin Taylor assumes. Does Iago really want an esteem-worthy self or is he driven, more simply, by what Coleridge called 'motiveless malignity'? Is gluttony always a misplaced search for human affection rather than just a fixation on food? And may the root of conceit not sometimes be just conceit rather than an unacknowledged feeling of inadequacy? These simpler origins certainly seem possible, and when they are present the resulting trait seems no less, and if anything more, vicious.

But even if Deadly Vices can leave one with doubts about its guiding neo-Aristotelian framework, there is a great deal of value in the book. Taylor's careful analyses of her seven central vices are deeply illuminating about the different forms they can take and the subtle ways in which they can harm their possessors. Moreover, in developing these analyses she takes the neo-Aristotelian view of virtue further than any other writer I know and so permits a more informed assessment of its merits. The seriousness of Taylor's attention both to the details of the vices she discusses and to the demands of her guiding theory are this book's principal, and considerable, virtues.