Death and Immortality in Ancient Philosophy

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A. G. Long, Death and Immortality in Ancient Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 232pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107086593.

Reviewed by Emily Austin, Wake Forest University


A. G. Long's book is, thankfully, not a handbook. There are surprisingly few sustained scholarly treatments of death and immortality in Ancient Greek philosophy, and the world does not need another 'guide.' Long has produced a monograph that takes interpretive risks and gives due attention to neglected dimensions of well-travelled ancient authors. The book both requires and rewards careful study, a verdict that will admittedly serve as an enticement to many readers and a caution to others.

Long divides the volume into two parts: 'Immortality' and 'Death.' It might seem strange to address the topics in that order, since humans who believe in immortality usually think the dying part comes first, as it does in the book's title. As I understand it, Long has at least two good reasons for inverting the order.

First, Long wants to foreground the point that immortality is, to borrow Aristotle's catchphrase, 'said in many ways.' While contemporary readers might think that the immortality at stake is the everlastingness of our individual selves, the ancient poets and philosophers were willing to consider a wide range of immortalities, including the possibility that neither humans nor gods are everlasting, though their long-lastingness might make them 'immortal' in some meaningful sense. Some sorts of immortality are even consistent with annihilation -- one might leave a mark through notoriety or production (e.g., fame, artistic works, surviving children), or one might gain immortality while alive by living a tranquil life worthy of an immortal. Long's claim that 'immortality' is not univocal widens the scope of immortality to include more philosophers and texts.

A second reason Long inverts the natural order of explanation is that it allows him to trouble the simple interpretive narrative that many readers might expect. On the standard account, Plato's philosopher believes in an immaterial soul and eagerly anticipates a personal, everlasting immortality. Epicurus, on the other hand, faces death fearlessly despite certainty of annihilation, rejecting talk of immortality as bad science. With more varieties of immortality on offer, Long can draw attention to the fact that Epicurus attributes immortality to the gods and, in some sense at least, to the best living Epicureans. Thus, Epicurus belongs in a suitably nuanced section on immortality, at least as much as does Aristotle's comparison of contemplation with immortal activity in Nicomachean Ethics 10. While one's first thought of Plato might be of the Phaedo's systematic defense of a relatively pedestrian form of personal immortality, Long examines passages in which Plato explores conceptions of immortality that are not clearly personal, not clearly everlasting, and are even consistent with annihilation.

Long's willingness to complicate traditional conceptions of Plato and Epicurus, as well as Aristotle and the Stoics, spans both sections of the book. In Part Two, 'Death,' Long explores whether doubt creeps into even Plato's paradigmatic defenses of personal immortality, and he suggests that Epicurus might think some fears of death are ineliminable and even natural.

These are good reasons for organizing the book in a counterintuitive way. Nevertheless, I think the reader's experience might have been better and less disjointed if the book were organized chronologically, keeping in mind that there are many kinds of immortality and that none of these philosophers are as dogmatic or one-dimensional as advertised. Long might have proceeded from the standard interpretation of the philosophers and their schools to a more fully articulated and controversial picture. In other words, a section on Plato might have moved from his more doctrinaire advocacy of personal immortality to his more nuanced, speculative, and even skeptical discussions. Epicurus might have likewise proceeded in the opposite direction, from his commitment to annihilation and his argument that fearing death is irrational, to his theism, political philosophy, and more subtle moral psychology.

Such an organization would have avoided some of the book's most jarring divisions. For example, the lengthy discussion of the Phaedo occurs in the death section, not the immortality section, and Long pays greater attention to the dialogue's lurking doubts than to Socrates's arguments and his confident pronouncements. While I welcome attention to Socrates's expressions of epistemic humility about the afterlife, a reader not well-versed in the dialogue might believe that the skeptical interpretation was more textually apparent than it is. Likewise, while Epicurus's treatment of immortality is fascinating, it is still not his central commitment. I think, then, that it should not appear before the standard view that Epicurus thinks death is not bad, despite the fact that death annihilates consciousness.

If the book were structured by author or school and proceeded from familiar to complicated, Long could also have better marked the points where his own claims are new or controversial. These are admittedly concerns about structure and reader experience rather than about Long's interpretations themselves. It does mean, though, that the reader needs familiarity with the relevant texts to navigate the book. Again, I welcome this challenge, but non-specialist readers should not expect a clear line of sight.

The book is certainly a proper survey in that it covers a wide body of texts. Plato gets the most attention. Long engages at some length with the Phaedrus, Symposium, Timaeus, Apology, Phaedo, and Laws. The spurious Axiochus even makes an appearance, where Socrates appears to advance a version of the 'Symmetry Argument' (though Long argues Socrates does not actually endorse it as a possibility). Long dodges discussion of Plato's afterlife myths, as well as the treatment of immortality in Laws 10 and Republic 10, but a single book obviously cannot cover everything.

Long addresses Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics 10 and his discussion of suicide, but he does not explore Aristotle's claim that courage involves facing what is most fearful -- death (EN 1115a, 1117b). Also unexplored are Aristotle's relatively confused speculations about postmortem harms in Nicomachean Ethics 1.10-11. For the good of all concerned, Long also avoids the intractable debate about De Anima 3.5. His discussion of Stoicism spans from Chrysippus to Cicero and Seneca; his discussion of Epicurus spans from Epicurus himself to Philodemus and Cicero. Scholars engaged with any of these texts will find something interesting.

Given that expansiveness, I obviously cannot weigh in everywhere I might like, so I will call attention to three points, the first two minor differences of interpretive opinion, and the last a ringing endorsement of a controversial claim.

In the opening chapter of Part Two, 'Death, Doubts, and Skepticism,' Long turns first to the Apology. Given Socrates's emblematic disavowal of knowledge, the Apology is a natural place to find Socrates claiming that he does not know whether death is good or bad, since he claims to know very little, if anything at all. Granted, he does sneak in an occasional positive claim under the camouflage of epistemic modesty -- that it's wrong to disobey one's superior (29b), impossible to harm anyone willingly (25d-26a), impossible for a good man to suffer harm from a worse man (30d), etc. Yet he claims quite directly that he does not know whether death is the greatest of evils or the greatest of goods (Ap. 29a-b).

Socrates's proud lack of confidence about death, though, gives way after his death sentence to an unexpected argument for the conclusion that death is beneficial, perhaps the greatest benefit. First, he claims that the persistent silence of his daimonion indicates that he has done nothing wrong in his defense, even though his defense has led to his death. The daimonion, then, must think it best for Socrates to die. Socrates then offers his audience an additional argument that they, too, should be of 'good hope' about death (Ap. 40c, 41c). He claims that 'death is one of two things,' argues that both of those things would be a benefit, and concludes that death must be beneficial. Instead of expressing uncertainty about whether death benefits or harms, Socrates expresses uncertainty only about what death will be (a 'dreamless sleep' or an afterlife where people are 'happier').

Which Socrates are we to trust -- the agnostic Socrates or the confident one? Long argues that we should privilege the former. As he puts it:

Socrates has spent his life making decisions with no view to whether death is good or bad, and at no point has he chosen to risk death in the belief, tentative or firm, that death will be advantageous to him . . . the positive evaluation of death comes in the post-ethical part of the speech: Socrates thinks of death as good only after he has committed himself to philosophy, even at the risk of death, and when it is too late to consider how best to speak and act during the trial. (97)

In some sense, I agree with Long -- Socrates has never chosen to risk death because of death's advantageousness. He chooses virtue because virtue benefits the possessor and avoids vice because vice harms the possessor. One might think, however, that he has never been genuinely skeptical about whether death will harm a person committed to justice. Consider some of his core beliefs: that good men cannot be harmed in life or death and that they are never neglected by the gods (41d). They jointly entail that when death arrives for a good person, death cannot be bad, and Socrates must have believed that as much before the verdict as after it. One might think his commitment to just action, his belief in divine care, and his belief that death will not harm him are part of the same coherent set of beliefs and desires that were present in the 'ethical' part of the speech as well.

Long's subsequent treatment of the Phaedo also calls welcome attention to the skepticism and doubt lurking at the margins of the discussion. Simmias thinks human reason might lack the capacity to settle questions about immortality (85c-e), and Socrates encourages him to keep examining their arguments (107a-b). Even Socrates acknowledges that the load-bearing columns of his arguments -- The Doctrine of Recollection and the Theory of the Forms -- are only hypotheses. Socrates makes clear that Simmias and Cebes will need to look for someone with whom to continue the practice of fighting their fear, and he cautions them about the risk of resenting argumentation. There are two points, however, I would have liked to see Long address.

First, Long might have made more of Socrates's resentment of annihilation in the Phaedo, given Socrates's willingness to consider it a benefit in the Apology. When Socrates prepares himself to face Cebes and Simmias's objections, he makes it clear that he agrees with Cebes -- if the soul is not immortal, in fact if it is not indestructibly immortal, then he is a fool not to resent dying (88b, 95d). Socrates admits that the likelihood of annihilation would, in fact, make him fall to pieces in an embarrassing way (91b). That does not happen, since he takes himself to have addressed their objections by the end of the dialogue. Yet it is worth noting that Socrates pretends to no consolatory arguments about annihilation, or even long-lastingness. It seems that only everlastingness will do for everyone concerned.

Second, Socrates litters the Phaedo with 'good hope,' the same phrase that closed out the Apology and which reappears throughout the corpus almost every time Socrates says anything about death and the afterlife (Phd. 67b8, 67c1, 70b, 63c5; 114c9; Ap. 40c5, 41c; R. 496e2). Long does not, unless I missed it, discuss this phrase or its epistemic import. On the surface, it suggests that Plato might always have recognized that arguments for everlasting immortality could only get you so far. He was never fully confident about the afterlife, though in all honesty, who could be?

Long's willingness to complicate Epicurus's moral psychology is, I think, one of the strongest parts of the book. Philosophers have long noted that Epicurus's traditional argument that 'death is nothing to us' only succeeds, insofar as it succeeds at all, at undermining the fear of being dead (Ep. Men. 124-5, KD 2). It has little or no effect on the fear of a painful death, an early death, a death that leaves one's children debtors, a friendless death, etc. Epicurus was no fool, so of course he must have thought his system would need to address those additional fears. Most scholars have argued that Epicurus thinks all varieties of the fear of death are irrational and eliminable through rational argumentation. Endorsing the right arguments makes the fear dissipate.

Long, on the other hand, thinks Epicurus (or at least Epicureans) might countenance some fears of death that are not eliminable through rational argumentation and that might even be natural and good. Long focuses in particular on the fear of leaving one's children in material or psychological distress, which is not so much fearing one's own death, but fearing one's death for the sake of others. Nevertheless, it is a reason to fear one's death, and it is not manifestly the sort of irrational fear one can be faulted for having.

Long calls attention to Philodemus's claim that a person can take care of this understandable fear with a will and confidence in the assurance of good friends. Both of these are practical strategies for managing the fear rather than arguments that the fear itself is irrational. As such, Epicurus, or at least his followers, might have thought some fears of death were natural and not eliminable through rational argumentation alone. Such fears can nevertheless be controlled through prudence, political arrangements, and friendship. I think Long has exactly the right reading on this front. While some scholars have claimed that Epicurus's decision to write a will marked a weakness or some kind of hypocrisy, it could instead have been a practical strategy that was an outgrowth of his moral psychology.

In sum, Long's book offers an argumentatively rich and wide-ranging treatment of a central theme in Ancient Greek metaphysics, ethics, and psychology. It is absolutely essential for anyone interested in serious research on the topic.