Death and Nonexistence

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Palle Yourgrau, Death and Nonexistence, Oxford University Press, 2019, 212pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190247478.

Reviewed by Steven Luper, Trinity University


In this book, Palle Yourgrau describes a puzzle he calls the paradox of nonexistence, offers a solution which involves positing objects that have a form of reality distinct from existence, and spells out some ways his framework may be used. In particular, he applies his framework in interesting ways to some issues in the philosophy of death, including the question of whether nonexistence is bad for those who die, those who are not yet born, and those who will never actually exist.

The paradox of nonexistence Yourgrau traces back to Parmenides of Elea, and expresses in the words of W. V. Quine: "Nonbeing must in some sense be, otherwise what is it that there is not?" The paradox arises when we say that something, e.g., Aphrodite, does not exist. In denying that Aphrodite exists, it seems, we need to refer to Aphrodite, but if we do that, then Aphrodite must be real in some sense -- a real object that does not exist.

Didn't Bertrand Russell solve the paradox with his theory of descriptions, which treats ordinary proper names as definite descriptions and, instead of using "exists" as a predicate, confines talk about existence to the existential quantifier? Using Russell's idea, we do not need to refer to Aphrodite to deny her existence. We can instead replace "Aphrodite" with a definite description like "the Greek goddess of love," and "Aphrodite does not exist" with "it is false that there exists a unique Greek goddess of love." Yourgrau says that Russell does not solve the paradox, since it will recur in the case of names that are not definite descriptions, not even in disguise -- names that are directly referential.

Yourgrau's own solution to the paradox involves two main moves.

First, we distinguish the ontological status of an historical entity such as Socrates from that of a merely fictional or mythical character such as Aphrodite or Sasquatch. This will allow us to acknowledge that Socrates is real without saying the same of fictional things.

Second, we distinguish between being and existence. This allows us to say that when an object like Socrates stops existing it does not altogether stop being real. As for what being is, here is what Yourgrau says:

Being . . . should be taken as a primitive notion represented formally by the existential quantifier -- informally by the words 'there is" -- and the predicate of existence should also be taken as primitive, in particular, not as definable in terms of identity and existential quantification. . . . Being is an ontological category that is a bridge between existence and nonexistence, underlying both. It's not a form of existence. . . . Unlike existence and nonexistence, being does not wax and wane, just like possibility, which suggests an intimate relationship between the two. . . . Whether that relationship is identity I leave open. I'm not claiming . . . only that "there might have been individuals that do not actually exist." I'm claiming that there are individuals that do not actually exist. Before he actually existed, Socrates was one of those individuals. (p. 27)

In view of Socrates's having being, we may say "there is such a person as Socrates." Taking exists to be a predicate, we may say "Socrates does not exist," or "Socrates has the property of nonexistence," marking the change in ontological status Socrates incurred when the predicate exists stopped applying to him.

Yourgrau treats Aphrodite very differently. Aphrodite lacks being, and it makes no sense to say, of what lacks being, either that it exists or does not exist, or even that it is possible. In the case of Aphrodite, what we should say is something like, "there is no such entity at all," or "Aphrodite is not part of the fabric of reality." (But note that it is also true, as Russell would have said, that "it is false that there exists a unique Greek goddess of love.")

So what beings are there? Yourgrau's reply to this question is "there is no pat answer." We have to decide on a case-by-case basis. For example, we know that "Socrates" has a referent since Socrates used to exist. By contrast, "Pegasus" is used merely to pretend to refer. Some beings never actually exist.

Still, in the case of at least some beings, he says that we can clarify when they start and stop existing, by relying on a variety of essentialism. Now, an essentialist who makes no distinction between existence and being might say that a thing's essence consists of those properties that it cannot lack if there is to be such an entity at all -- properties it cannot be without if it is to remain that very same entity. But Yourgrau wants to discuss features whose loss took Socrates out of existence, and to distinguish these from features without which Socrates could not have being. To help us to keep matters straight, Yourgrau distinguishes between "two senses of essence:"

Essence* constitutes those properties something simply cannot lose. Essence** constitutes those properties something cannot lose while continuing to exist. Part of Socrates's essence* is to be a living-thing, a thing which cannot exist unless it's alive. Part of Socrates's essence** is to be alive. Socrates is dead. He is a living-thing that has ceased to be alive. . . . When a living thing dies it becomes a nonexistent living-thing. (p. 39)

When I first read this passage, I was pretty sure that, by "properties something cannot lose while continuing to exist," Yourgrau meant to refer to properties something cannot lose while continuing to actually exist. But I also thought that, by "a thing which cannot exist unless it's alive," he meant to refer to a thing which cannot actually exist unless it's alive. And I thought he might believe that alive is not part of Socrates's essence*. I wondered whether Yourgrau would say that Socrates currently exists in some nonactual worlds without being alive in them. Things he says later in the book paint a different picture. Yourgrau's view clearly is that alive is not only part of Socrates's essence**, it is also part of his essence*. More on that shortly.

On the strength of his assumptions about beings and their essences, Yourgrau rejects Fred Feldman's case against the termination thesis, which holds that "when they die, things simply cease to exist." Feldman rejected this thesis on the grounds that living things are material objects that may continue to exist as corpses. That cannot be true if living things cannot continue to exist without being alive. Yourgrau also takes issue with the many writers who claim that things that stop (actually) existing also stop being in any condition or state of being at all. Such writers tend to deny that we may incur harm while dead, or before we are alive, or if we are never born, since nothing is there to be harmed. That, Yourgrau thinks, overlooks his idea that the never born, the not yet born, and the dead are beings. So, he asks, "isn't it obvious . . . that it's the dead person who is suffering the greatest harm from his death?" (p. 49)

In Chapter 6, Yourgrau spells out his view of the nature of possible worlds in fuller detail. We learn that he is a modal realist who thinks that other possible worlds are concrete in the same sense that the actual world is. (Yet he rejects David Lewis's view that each world is actual only relative to the others. Yourgrau calls himself a "modal chauvinist." [p. 110]) Possible worlds are real. They do not exist, but they have being, so we can quantify over them. Crucially, Yourgrau combines his realism with the thesis of transworld identity (p. 31, footnote 22). Socrates lived in the actual world roughly from 469-399BC. As a transworld identity theorist, Yourgrau claims that there is a possible world in which that very same object, Socrates, instead lived from 500-399, and a possible world in which the very same object instead lived from 469-370. One and the same object, Socrates (not one of his counterparts, à la Lewis), is in all three worlds (as well as countless others, of course). We can add that, as Yourgrau writes in Chapter 3, when Socrates died, "he didn't cease being concrete. He went from being an existent concrete object to being a nonexistent concrete object." (p. 47) Socrates is identical to a concrete object that once existed in the actual world and that currently exists in lots of other possible worlds.

In light of what we learn in Chapter 6, we could restate Yourgrau's claim that Socrates "is a living-thing that has ceased to be alive, which is why he has ceased to exist" as follows: Socrates cannot exist in any possible world without being alive in that world (living is essential* to him), and Socrates has ceased to be alive in the actual world, which is why he has ceased to exist in the actual world. When he denies that a thing that stops existing also stops being in any state of being, he means that one and the same object that stops existing in the actual world continues to exist, and is in some condition, in some other worlds.

It is trickier to pin down what he means when he says "it's the dead person who is suffering the greatest harm from his death." (p. 179, he adds that "nonexistence is, all else being equal, a bad way to be.") It is clear that he thinks we can pin down the subject of the harm. In fact, he thinks it is obvious who the subject is. In the case of Socrates, the subject who is suffering is Socrates, currently existing in many possible worlds. For example, there is a world, call it W, in which, ever since 469, he has been living well, has just finished reading Yourgrau's book, and is currently enjoying a glass of wine while chatting with Moses about the fact that neither of them actually exist. What is tricky to capture is the harm Socrates is currently suffering in W due to his not having lived past 399 in the actual world. (Of course, it is also true that, despite his good fortune in W, all is not well with Socrates. Everything that could possibly happen to Socrates, good or bad, does happen to him, in one world or another, on Yourgrau's view.)

Finally, let me address Yourgrau's critical discussion of some brief comments I made in an online article about some of the work he published before this book. My comments were intended to draw attention to some things I thought could use clarification. The gist of it is that for people and other living things, Yourgrau seemed (to me) to equate being alive with being actual, which did not square with other things he said. But my reading, it turns out, was completely off base. His view is that the object we call "Socrates" is in many possible worlds, and alive in a world if and only if he exists in that world.

Unfortunately, in his discussion of my comments, Yourgrau attributes to me the view that it is possible literally to travel from one possible world to another. Let me be clear that, like most philosophers, I reject modal realism, so I deny the absurd claim that we can move ourselves from the actual world into some merely possible worlds, as well as Yourgrau's own claim that we are already in them.