Death and the Afterlife

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Samuel Scheffler, Death and the Afterlife, Niko Kolodny (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2013, 210pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199982509.

Reviewed by John Cottingham, Heythrop College University of London/University of Reading


Despite its title, this book is not about "the afterlife" as normally understood -- the continuation of some form of personal existence after death, in the "next world". Samuel Scheffler, in line with many Western philosophers and intellectuals, firmly rejects any such idea. The subject of these fluently argued and thought provoking reflections (based on Scheffler's s two 2012 Tanner lectures at Berkeley with the addition of a third paper delivered at Chicago the previous year) is the assumption tacitly made by each of us that human life -- the ordinary, this‑worldly life of other members of our species -- will continue long after our own individual deaths. This is the "afterlife" that Scheffler has in mind, and part of his aim is to show what an enormously important role in our outlook is played by our assumption that there will be such an "afterlife" after we are gone.

Of course we know that humanity will not last forever, but we nevertheless expect the human race to endure for a good long while yet. But now imagine a "doomsday" scenario in which a giant asteroid is on course to collide with the earth and destroy the planet thirty years after the life of our generation has come to an end: would we not be devastated by the knowledge that all human life will end so (comparatively) soon after we are gone?

That the prospect of earth's imminent destruction would affect us so profoundly shows that it matters to us what happens after we are no longer here; and the "mattering", Scheffler argues, is not just a function of our own present distress as we contemplate this dire outcome, nor is it merely a function of any consequentialist type assessment that the net total amount of future happiness will be thereby reduced (for of course the end of human life would mean an end to future cruelty, injustice and suffering as well as an end to good things). The notion of things mattering to us seems closely bound up with our wanting them to be sustained and preserved, and indeed Scheffler draws the striking moral that "we need humanity to have a future for the very idea that things matter to retain a secure place in our conceptual repertoire" (60).

One of the most interesting aspects of Scheffler's development of these themes is the contrast he draws between individual survival and the survival of humanity in general. Many people today have given up any hope of personal immortality as traditionally promised in some religions, but for the most part this does not appear to prevent them continuing to value their various activities, projects and relationships, and investing them with great significance (p. 71). Yet in the doomsday asteroid scenario, and in other science-fiction stories like P. D. James's The Children of Men, where humanity faces extinction due to mass infertility, the assumption is that the imminent end of our species would produce widespread "apathy, anomie, and despair . . . and . . . a pervasive loss of conviction about the value or point of many activities" (p. 40). If this assumption is accurate, then a striking result follows: our confidence that others will survive after we die is a much more important condition of things mattering to us than any belief we may have that we will individually enjoy life after death. While not denying the general importance of self-interested motivation, Scheffler concludes that in this one remarkable respect we are far less selfish than is often supposed: "there is a very specific sense in which our own survival is less important to us than the survival of the human race" (73).

What Scheffler has given us here is a fascinating example of philosophical reflection leading to a more altruistic construal of the human condition -- one that is reminiscent in some ways of that found many years ago in Derek Parfit's Reasons and Persons. But whereas Parfit aimed to dissolve the "glass tunnel" separating the individual from others by deconstructing the idea of personal identity across time, Scheffler regards any view that denies the existence of a personal egocentric subject as "incredible" (103). Unlike Parfit, moreover, Scheffler considers the fear of death and dying to be reasonable (or at least not unreasonable), and this notwithstanding the fact that he agrees with Bernard Williams's celebrated contention (in "The Makropulos Case") that personal immortality would not be something to be desired (107). In his rich and nuanced final lecture, devoted to the question of death, Scheffler argues that "it is essential to our idea of a life that it is temporally bounded, with a beginning, a middle, and an end" (100). And this connects crucially with what makes life worthwhile, for "the aspects of life that we cherish most dearly -- love and labor, intimacy and achievement, creativity and humor and solidarity and all the rest -- all have the status of values for us because of their role in our finite and bounded lives" (100). The upshot is that in a certain sense it is death that gives meaning to life.

But this in turn leads to a conclusion that the author himself confesses to finding "strange and unsettling". Although we (rightly) fear death, immortality is no solution, and indeed death is needed to sustain our confidence in the importance of what we value. Yet at the same time that confidence depends on our belief that other humans will be alive after we die (109). Scheffler thus takes on board the lesson of Makropulos, but adds to it the lesson that emerges at the end of the final act of another Janáček opera, The Cunning Little Vixen, where the grief of the mourning forester is checked as a tiny frog unexpectedly jumps onto his lap -- the grandson of the one who did so in act one. Life continues.

The volume includes not just Scheffler's three comparatively short but concentrated and powerful lectures, but also a set of four concise reactions by Susan Wolf, Harry Frankfurt, Seana Valentine Shiffrin, and Niko Kolodny, together with Scheffler's responses. Among the points raised by Frankfurt is a question as to whether our desire for the human race to continue after we are gone is actually as altruistic as Scheffler implies; and he goes on to beat the well-worn reductionistic Darwinian drum, holding that the significance of our desires for the continued life of the species may come down to not much more than the brute fact that "natural selection has ensured that we have those desires" (138).

In the most interesting of the critiques, Wolf questions a key premise of Scheffler's argument, namely that the impending doomsday event would undercut our faith in the value and significance of our projects. Taking a more robustly optimistic line than Scheffler, she argues that humanity's impending extinction would of course be disorienting and unsettling at first, but that there is no good reason why we should not in due course "snap out of it" (128). Taking the case of Alvy Singer (the nerdy grade school pupil in Woody Allen's film Annie Hall, who says there's no point in doing his homework because the universe is expanding and doomed to fizzle out), Wolf draws the opposite conclusion from Scheffler. For Scheffler, if Alvy had known that the world would end not in billions of years but in eighty years or so, then his reluctance to do his homework would have had a point. For Wolf, just as there is ample time and reason for Alvy to do some useful homework, so contemplating the future extinction of humanity, even were it to become an imminent prospect, still would, or certainly should, allow us to find time and motivation to continue to strive to "create beauty, gain wisdom and help each other" (127).

In focusing on the normative question of how we ought to react to the doomsday scenario, rather than the philosophically less interesting empirical question of how we would in fact react to it, Wolf has I think given an important impetus to what is sure to be an extended debate over this book and its arguments. Given the nature of the topics addressed in the book, however, focusing as they do on human finitude and the significance of our lives and projects, I must confess to having some residual disquiet about the way Scheffler, along with all his critics, resolutely leaves out of court any religious insights or reflections, as if these could not possibly be even candidates for making a contribution to the issues raised. Let me not be misunderstood here: it is completely reasonable for Scheffler to exclude the religious idea of personal immortality at the outset, so as to clear the ground for examining the afterlife in his different and special sense. But there is a great deal more to religious tradition and thought than the doctrine of personal immortality -- indeed that doctrine is by no means as central to the religious outlook as is often supposed. By contrast, the idea of our finitude plays a central role in many religious scriptures, notably in the Judeo-Christian tradition. The whole cosmos, says the Psalms, will "wear out like a garment", and a great deal of biblical teaching is premised on the idea that the end of human life is potentially imminent, or that the time of its end is unknown and unknowable. It is against precisely that backdrop of vulnerability and finitude that religious injunctions about the significance of how we live are articulated, and the categorical requirements to show compassion, to help those in distress, and so on, are insisted upon. So there is a certain cultural impoverishment, I think, in Scheffler's considering his momentous problems of meaning, mortality and the future of humanity only via examples drawn from recent science fiction novels and movies, when the reality is that the relevant problems have been wrestled over for many centuries, with a rich inherited store of religious reflection waiting to be drawn on with profit even by philosophers who cannot accept the accompanying theistic metaphysics.

This qualm aside, Scheffler has produced a superb essay -- indeed it seems to me about as good as analytic philosophy gets. It is entirely free from obfuscating jargon and other tiresome tricks of the trade, yet it is meticulously argued and demanding in exactly the right way -- forcing us to think about hitherto unexamined implications of our existing beliefs. Though written with agreeable lightness and fluency, it is rich in psychological and ethical insight, and restores philosophy to its proper role of tackling the big structural concerns that are inseparable from the human condition. And if the big structural concerns are, in a sense, ones that have been with us for centuries, there is no denying the sharpness and originality of the new slant that Scheffler employs to tackle them. Finally, with the appended comments of the critics and the author's detailed replies, it provides plenty of pointers for students who want to get their teeth into the important issues raised, making the ensemble a volume that is highly to be recommended.