Death or Disability?: The 'Carmentis Machine' and Decision-making for Critically Ill Children

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Dominic Wilkinson, Death or Disability?: The 'Carmentis Machine' and Decision-making for Critically Ill Children, Oxford University Press, 2013, 311pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199669431.

Reviewed by John D. Lantos, Children's Mercy Hospital, Kansas City, MO


Let me suggest three ways to read Wilkinson's Death or Disability?.

1. As the best book of the decade in bioethics

Dominic Wilkinson is a philosopher and neonatologist at the Women's and Children's Hospital in Adelaide. He is also a consultant for the Oxford Uehiro Centre for Practical Ethics. His research focuses on the thorny ethical dilemmas that arise in the care of critically ill newborns. Wilkinson has been working out an approach to these difficult problems for the last decade. He has gathered his thoughts together in a marvelous, engaging and challenging book.

The book includes case studies, analyses of the works of many philosophers who have addressed the issues that arise in neonatal bioethics, analyses of clinical epidemiological studies on outcomes for tiny babies, and some delightful diversions into ancient Roman mythology. Wilkinson's style makes difficult issues accessible not only to a beginner in the field of bioethics but also to a lay audience. His rigor and comprehensiveness make the book useful for experienced neonatologists and bioethicists.

In short, this is a book that must be read by everybody who is seriously interested in the bioethical issues that arise in neonatal intensive care or, more generally, in decision making for children with chronic, debilitating or life-threatening conditions. Wilkinson critically summarizes the work in this field over the last two decades and adds his own insights to that work.

2. As an illustration of the limits of philosophy

The book also illustrates the limits of philosophy when dealing with these issues.

Wilkinson's approach is what might be called a standard philosophical one. He describes a situation or a case that raises a moral dilemma. Generally, the moral dilemma is one of a perceived rational inconsistency: people who endorse a particular value act in a way that seems to violate that value commitment. He then proposes some intuitive responses to that dilemma. These generally take the form of statements that begin with phrases like, "One answer to the question . . . " or "We might suppose that the right choice is . . . " He then shows why those intuitive answers are inadequate, introduced with phrases such as, "There are several challenges to this answer . . . ." Or "What arguments might be raised against this?" After the various potential answers are proposed and the problems with those answers are highlighted, he offers a third or fourth or fifth answer which is, he claims, the answer that best addresses the original question without the inadequacies of the previous answers. Often, a reader can think of objections to his final answer. It seems to be as vulnerable as the others. It isn't clear that this philosophical approach has led to incontrovertible conclusions.

As an example, his chapter on "Competing Interests" begins with "the sad case of RB." RB was a thirteen month old who was quadriplegic and dependent upon a ventilator. RB had been in the intensive care unit all his life. His long-term survival would be possible with a tracheotomy and home ventilation. His parents disagreed about how to proceed. His mother wanted to let him die. His father wanted to continue treatment. What to do?

Wilkinson frames the issue as one of parental rights. Why, he asks, should parents have a say in such decisions? One reason is that they may have special insight into what is in the child's interests. Another is that they may have relevant interests of their own, interests that will be affected by the decision made for RB.

Wilkinson searches for analogies. "Is there a difference," he asks, "between taking into account the effect of disability on the interest of parents/siblings and taking into account the effect of gender?" (121). Wilkinson argues against this analogy by making a justice claim. An impaired child will make disproportionate claims on a parents' time, money, and energy "even in a perfectly just society" (122). The same is not true, he claims, for gender differences. But are we in a perfectly just society, viewed either from the standpoint of disability or of gender? Wilkinson contrasts the response he might expect from an idealist ("we should make our decisions as if we were in an ideal world" (122)) with that which might be expected from a pragmatist ("identify as far as possible the impact on interests that the family is likely to face" (122)). He cites studies showing that doctors do, in fact, consider family interests in making decisions for babies such as RB. He then reviews philosophical arguments made by Peter Singer, Helga Kuhse, Annie Janvier, Laine Ross, Jeff McMahan, John Broome, Ben Bradley, and others. He offers logic statements that highlight the ways in which our thinking is rationally flawed. He concludes that there are good reasons to consider family interests and there may even be better reasons to consider those interests when the patient is an infant than when the patient is an older child. He carefully addresses objections to this conclusion. Finally, he summarizes his carefully considered conclusion: "it is legitimate and reasonable to give some weight to the likely impact on families of decisions about treatment" (151).

I agree with this conclusion but don't find the reasoning by which he gets to it particularly compelling. So I question whether Wilkinson's philosophical approach is working in the way that he seems to suggest, that is, as an impartial and rational evaluation of the strengths and weaknesses of different arguments that leads, logically, to the strongest argument.  Or whether, instead, this philosophical approach is used simply as a way to lend credibility to or justify a conclusion that is actually arrived at based on political or religious or psychological factors.

In his 1985 book, Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy, Bernard Williams argues that "the resources of most modern moral philosophy are not well adjusted to the modern world." This is because, according to Williams, modern moral philosophy "is governed by a dream of a community of reason that is too far removed . . . from social and historical reality."[1] The social and historical realities of neonatal intensive care have served up a heady mix of difficult dilemmas. They are dilemmas for parents, for doctors and nurses, and, ultimately, for the societies that decide the boundaries of individual liberties and the strength of societal protections for the most vulnerable citizens.

Forty years ago, Richard A. McCormick addressed the very same problems that Wilkinson analyzes.[2] McCormick argued that what he called "Judeo-Christian values" demanded that we sometimes decide to let a baby die. "Life is not a value to be preserved in and for itself," he wrote. "To maintain that would commit us to a form of medical vitalism that makes no human or Judeo-Christian sense."

McCormick struggled to articulate criteria that could be used to define the situations in which decisions to forego life-sustaining treatment might be ethically permissible:

we cannot always establish perfectly rational accounts and norms for our decisions. But I believe we must never cease trying, in fear and trembling to be sure. . . . if we must face the frightening task of making quality-of-life judgments -- and we must -- then we must face the difficult task of building criteria for these judgments.

McCormick focused on the potential for human relationships as the most important criterion for determining whether we had an obligation to sustain the life of a baby:

a guideline that may help in decision about sustaining the lives of grossly deformed and deprived infants . . . is the potential for human relationships associated with the infant's condition. If that potential is simply non-existent or would be utterly submerged and undeveloped in the mere struggle to survive, that life has achieved its potential.

McCormick's discussion was rooted in Catholic theology.

A few years later, the President's Commission for the Study of Bioethics addressed the same problem.[3] They also acknowledged that such decisions had to be made and that we needed criteria to make them. Their solution was more procedural than substantive. They imagined that both parents and doctors might have opinions about whether medical treatment ought to be discontinued in particular cases. They classified medical assessments of the effectiveness of treatment into three categories: 1) clearly beneficial, 2) clearly futile, and 3) a middle category that they called "outcome ambiguous or uncertain." They then argued that when treatment was clearly beneficial, it should be provided even if the parents prefer to forego treatment. When the outcome is ambiguous or uncertain, they recommend deferring to the parents. They acknowledge that the most difficult cases are those in which babies might survive with "permanent handicaps." In that situation,

the President's Commission has concluded . . . that a very restrictive standard is appropriate: such permanent handicaps justify a decision not to provide life-sustaining treatment only when they are so severe that continued existence would not be a net benefit to the infant. . .

"They acknowledge that this standard is "somewhat subjective and imprecise" but call on parents and practitioners to use "prudent and discerning judgment." 

The Bioethics Commission discussion drew heavily on reasoning from the principles of common law. Their solutions look very similar to those that both McCormick and Wilkinson reach. The broad agreement is reassuring. Regardless of the methods that we use to reach conclusions, we all arrive at more or less the same place. We set a threshold of sorts and allow limits on medical treatment when a particular baby is at or below that threshold. Each approach, of course, allows for tough cases when the circumstances of the case are such that it is unclear on which side of the threshold it falls.

3. As a challenging thought experiment

Wilkinson's book nudges the discussion forward with a challenging thought experiment. The experiment gives the book its subtitle: The 'Carmentis Machine' and decision-making for critically ill children. The idea of a "Carmentis Machine" is based on the practice, in ancient Rome, of consulting the priestess Carmentis after the birth of a baby. She was believed to be capable of predicting the baby's future and would make recommendations about whether, given that future, the baby would live or die.

Wilkinson uses the myth to ask the following question: what if prognostication improved to the point that we could know, for certain, exactly how impaired a child might be? In other words, what if the element of uncertainty about prognosis that figures so prominently in neonatal decisions today could be eliminated. Would that make it easier or harder to make decisions for neonates? One's intuitive response is that it would be easier. Uncertainty leads to ambivalence and doubt about the correct course of action. But certainty, Wilkinson shows, would force us to more explicitly confront the factors that go into our assessments of quality of life. We would need to define, precisely, what makes a life worth living or not worth living. In that sense, uncertainty allows decisions that might be prohibited if we had perfect knowledge.

In the end, Wilkinson falls back on a schema very much like that of the President's Commission. He wants to preserve the parental prerogative to make these decisions with some societal oversight. He calls this a "modified liberal strategy" by which, when there is

genuine and legitimate disagreement about whether or not treatment is in the interests of the child we should reasonably defer to the views of parents or caregivers. . . . Where parents' views fall outside the bounds of reasonable disagreement, where their decision appears likely to cause substantial harm, we should override their choices. (258)

These conclusions are the ones that, as McCormick notes, are those that "a community of reasonable persons" might endorse. McCormick also summarizes the tensions. What we are doing, he says, is making "a quality-of-life judgment in a way that both expresses and reinforces our concern for the sanctity of life."[4] McCormick acknowledges that there is something inherently paradoxical, irreducibly intuitive, and mysterious here. That may be the best that we can do.

[1] Williams, B.  Ethics and the limits of philosophy. Harvard, Cambridge, MA. 1985, p. 197.

[2] McCormick, R. A. To save or let die: the dilemma of modern medicine.  JAMA 1974; 229: 172-6.

[3] President’s Commission for the Study of Ethical Problems in Medicine and Biomedical and Behavioral Research. Deciding to Forego Life-Sustaining Treatment. US Government Printing Office, Washington DC. 20402.  1983, p. 218.

[4] McCormick, R. A. The quality of life, the sanctity of life.  Hastings Center Report, 1978; 8(1): 30-6.